The Value of Humanity in Kant's Moral Theory

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Richard Dean, The Value of Humanity in Kant's Moral Theory, Oxford University Press, 2006, 270pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199285721.

Reviewed by Patrick R. Frierson, Whitman College


Richard Dean aims not only to revolutionize the way Kantians think about the Formula of Humanity, but to generate whole new approaches to both Kant scholarship and the use of Kant in applied ethics.  Dean's originality is based on his unique solution to a common problem with Kant's Groundwork.  At the beginning of the Groundwork, Kant claims that the only thing good without qualification is the good will (4: 393).  But in his discussion of the formula of humanity, Kant claims that "rational nature" or "the human being and in general every rational being" exists "as an end in itself" (4:428).  Kant seems to shift from valuing the good will to simply valuing rational nature as such.  For many Kantians, this shift is both an important insight and a troubling problem.  The insight is found in the fact that although in one sense one wants to ascribe the highest value only to a good will, it also seems important to extend respect to all human beings, or at least to all agents capable of self-governance.  But the problem comes from the need to explain how agency as such can be an end in itself when the only thing that is good without qualification is the good will.  Taking its inspiration from Kant's claim that "morality, and humanity insofar as it is capable of morality, is that which alone has dignity" (4: 425, cf. Dean: 41, 75-6), the most common approach to this problem is to argue that while "humanity" is a broader category than "good will," there is an intimate connection between good wills and the rational nature that makes good wills possible.[1]

Richard Dean offers an alternative solution to the problem of an apparent gap between the good will and humanity; Dean simply denies that there is any gap at all.  Instead, he turns the problem of making sense of the connection between the good will and humanity into an argument for the identity of these two concepts in Kant.[2]  As Dean explains,

Reading 'humanity' as 'good will' … fares better than minimal readings [such as those that identify humanity with rational nature] in making Kant's basic claims about value in the Groundwork consistent.  Kant begins the Groundwork with the claim that only a good will is good without qualification, and that only a good will has an incomparably high value, or dignity.  Later in Groundwork, he says that only humanity is an end in itself, and only humanity has a dignity.  A thorough analysis of these claims reveals that something that has an incomparably high value, and is valuable without qualification, must also be an end in itself.  So good will must be the end in itself.  (8; this argument is unpacked in excessive detail on pp. 35-42)

This argument turns into a sort of mantra of the first half of the book, that "if humanity is something other than virtue, Kant appears stuck with a deep inconsistency" (54-5, see too pp. 34, 35-42).  And the book as a whole is meant to be a sustained defense of the formula of humanity on Dean's good will interpretation.  The first half of the book offers exegetical defense of this reading.  The second half of the book defends the good will version of FH as a principle for normative and applied ethics.

Chapters 1 and 2 introduce Dean's central claim that humanity is equivalent to virtue in Kant.  In this context, Dean highlights several different minimal readings, ranging from the most minimal "power to set ends" account of humanity to a more substantive readings that include "a larger set of … features" such as "the ability to compare one's … ends and organize them into a systematic whole" or even "the capacity to act morally" (25).  In chapters 3 - 6, Dean aims to show how his reading is more consistent than alternative readings with "both the large themes of Kant's ethics [chapters 3 and 6] and the particular texts [chapter 4]" (9).[3] 

By the end of chapter 4, Dean's positive argument for his good will reading of humanity is finished, but the rest of the book offers a sustained defense of this reading against three main objections.  In chapter 5, Dean asks the question that will have been haunting readers for the first four chapters: "Is the Good Will Reading Just Too Hard to Swallow?" (91).  There Dean considers two problems.  First, he argues against the accusation that on his reading, "the humanity reading becomes unpalatably moralistic," especially in that "the humanity formulation, on the good will reading, grounds duties only to agents who have a good will, and does not prohibit any kind of abuse of agents who lack a good will" (91).  Second, he responds to the contention that the good will reading of humanity "may seem silly if there are actually few agents with good wills" (96). 

In chapters 6 - 11, Dean answers a third objection: that the good will reading would be devastating in its application to real moral problems, both normative and applied.  Dean aims to show how "the humanity formulation, on the good will reading, is a viable moral principle, and provides substantial guidance on practical issues" (9).[4]  Chapter 6 focuses on a proof of FH with Dean's new interpretation of FH.  Chapter 7 discusses how duties follow from FH, including a long and detailed examination of the role of respect in deriving specific duties.  Chapter 8 is an argument that, due to "a mistake about Kant's conception of value" (157), both Christine Korsgaard and David Cummiskey present overly strong readings of FH, Korsgaard requiring that others' ends have the same status as one's own, Cummiskey devolving into Kantian utilitarianism.[5]  Chapter 9 turns more specifically to applied ethics, taking up the issue of animal rights; Dean argues that we have moral responsibilities to animals based on his "moral constructivist" approach to applied ethics.  Chapter 10 takes up the role of autonomy in bioethics.  Dean argues that "For Kant, autonomy plays a role in the deep justification of moral theory, but is not specified as a direct object of moral concern" (198).  Further, given his rereading of FH, Dean argues that what one ought to respect in others is not the mere capacity for choice, but only this capacity when it is part of a good will, and he claims that this principle solves several important problems in bioethics.  Chapter 11 is a continued discussion of autonomy, focusing on Dean's rejection of the idea that autonomy or mere freedom of choice can be an end in itself.  And Dean's conclusion highlights the advantages of his theory against theories that locate the value of humanity in the power to choose.

How successful is Dean's argument?  Dean himself dramatically lowers the bar for what counts as a successful argument by repeatedly insisting that there is simply no way to make all of Kant's texts consistent: "there is no perfectly consistent and univocal sense that attaches to Kant's uses of the word 'humanity'" (65, cf. 76, 79, 84-5, 243). Nonetheless, Dean argues that his reading fits better with more texts and makes more sense of most of Kant's larger themes.  And, while he admits that his theory might have some problems in application, it has fewer problems than minimal readings.  Even with this lowered bar for success, however, Dean's account suffers from some serious shortcomings.

While Dean does provide some narrower proof-texts for his view, ultimately Dean's positive argument -- both textually and in terms of "larger themes" -- rests on whether or not the minimalist reading really is guilty of a "deep inconsistency" in treating both the good will and humanity as unconditionally good/ends-in-themselves while denying that they are identical in the strict sense.[6]  The intuitive appeal of this point is very strong, and this intuition is what drives the problem with which I began this review.  Dean is also correct that this problem has been underappreciated by Kantians who defend minimalist readings of humanity.  But Dean's criticism of these minimalist readings suffers from his consistent failure to read its proponents in a charitable way.  This lack of charity reaches a climax when Dean offers a sustained argument (pp. 158-165) against Korsgaard's claim that you have "a duty to give the same weight to others' contingent ends as you do to your own," pausing only once to note that Korsgaard "appears to disavow th[is] extreme conclusion" (158).  The lack of charity is evident in other places as well, such as Dean's claim that "minimal readings demand" "that we aid others in achieving their immoral ends" (53), when in fact (again by his own admission), proponents of minimal readings actually demand no such thing.[7]

More fundamental than these particular misreadings of the implications of a minimalist account of FH, Dean just does not seem to get the basic minimalist argument for the connection between valuing rational nature as such -- that is, the capacity to set ends for oneself, with or without some further capacities[8] -- and that purely rational nature that Kant calls the good will.  Briefly, I take the central idea of these minimalist readings to be the following: what must be considered an end in itself, and what has dignity, is precisely rational nature, or the capacity for choice.[9]  This capacity has unconditional value in the sense that it ought to be valued regardless of circumstances or inclinations.  But the value of the mere capacity for choice is conditioned in two respects that do not apply to the good will.  First, the particular choices of a particular person ought to be valued only when valuing those choices is consistent with respecting the capacities for choice of all other persons.[10]  Even in this case, of course, the capacity for choice itself must be respected, just not its particular use.  Thus one can refuse to give a murderer a gun, but one cannot torture him to make him give up his evil intent.  Second, the capacity for choice itself, while unconditionally an end (and in that sense valuable), is not unconditionally good.  One who uses the capacity for choice in an evil way is an evil person, and thus the capacity for choice is not unconditionally valuable in the sense of good.[11]  But a wholly good will[12] is a will whose choices are consistent with respect for the capacity for choice of everyone, and such a will is unconditionally valuable in both of the senses in which a mere capacity for choice is not.  The choices of such a wholly good will must always be respected since they can never conflict with valuing the capacities for choice of others, and the wholly good will is "good without qualification" because it can never be bad in any respect.  Thus the capacity for choice is unconditionally valuable in the sense that it is always an end in itself that is worthy of respect, but only a wholly good will is unconditionally valuable in the further senses that its choices must always be respected and that it is unconditionally good.  On this reconstruction, moreover, one can characterize what the good will is only by first positing the value of the mere capacity for choice, and the good will turns out to be, as Korsgaard suggests, precisely the full realization of the value of this capacity for choice.[13]

It is too bad that Dean never really gets this argument, because it leaves the force of his defense of the good will reading against minimalist readings resting primarily on the prima facie force of the problem of reconciling Kant's apparently conflicting assertions in the Groundwork.  For readers sympathetic with the position I laid out in the preceding paragraph, there is little refutation of it in Dean's book.  The closest that he comes is the following:[14]

A competing picture could claim that freedom of choice is in fact of fundamental importance, and so one individual's freedom should be limited only when it conflicts with others' freedom.  Although this picture is familiar, it faces the same intuitive problem that the principle of respect for bioethics autonomy faces.  It treats even immoral choices which harm others as being prima facie worth preserving, but as merely outweighed by consideration of others' freedom.  This picture seems less satisfying than a picture on which such immoral choices do not have a status that gives them even prima facie theoretical weight.  Of course, all of this is just to state my intuition on the matter, and would not convince someone with very different intuitions.  But I think when presented with these two competing pictures of the moral significance of immoral choices, many people would share my intuition.  And, most importantly for exegetical purposes, Kant shares it.  (250)

Those who "share [Dean's] intuition" will likely find much else in his book with which they will resonate.  I find the notion of "outweighing" to be an inadequate redescription of the relationship between wills described in the previous paragraph, and I am concerned about Dean's claim that not only will immoral choices of bad wills have no regard, but even morally neutral choices of bad wills have no weight when set against choices -- even bad choices! -- of good wills.[15]  But for exegetical purposes, it is at least worth noting that Dean's exegetical point rests on the philosophical implausibility of reconciling respect for good wills with respect for choice as such, and thus it is not at all clear that Kant shares Dean's intuitions here.

In the rest of this review, I briefly take up Dean's response to the objection that his good will reading is excessively moralistic.  Dean responds to this objection by offering three arguments to show that we should treat all other rational agents as if they have good wills.  First, he claims that because one can never be sure whether or not any given agent has a good will, one should err on the side of respect: "She must be presumed to be an end in herself for roughly the same reason that a defendant in an American court is presumed innocent" (93).  Second, he argues that we have a moral obligation to treat even bad wills with respect because only thereby can we help promote good wills in those who presently lack them: "the vicious person possesses all the ingredients necessary to have a good will, so we should not do anything to interfere with her coming to acquire one" (95).  And Dean offers a final argument for treating all people with respect in the context of an argument for treating even animals with respect (in chapter 9).  This argument depends upon Dean's moral constructivism, according to which moral rules are just those that would be agreed upon by a hypothetical union of good wills.  Because these rules are allowed, and even required, to give "at least some weight to other [good will]'s contingent ends," the fact that "most members of the union care about the treatment of other sentient beings, even if those beings lack a commitment to morality, … would provide a reason to prohibit the mistreatment of such beings" (187).

In my opinion, none of these responses to the basic worry about disrespect for non-good wills is sufficient.  The first is insufficient because, contrary to Dean, Kant does think that we can reliably tell that other human beings are evil.[16]  Moreover, even if we cannot identify every evil will, and even if we give the benefit of the doubt to wills about which we are not sure, because respect is due only to good wills, and because there can be evidence for the presence of an evil will in others, it seems incumbent upon us to do the best we can to distinguish good from evil.  The second argument is on more solid ground because it rightly recognizes something of value even in the capacity for a good will, but even this argument is overly moralistic because it implies that the only reason to respect the morally neutral wishes of agents who are not morally good is that such respect helps make them morally better.  But this is both morally and psychologically false.  It is morally false not only for the question-begging reason that it fails to accord to other free agents the respect that they are owed under a minimalist reading of FH, but also because it assumes that moral agents have the obligation to actively promote the good wills of others, something that Kant explicitly denies (6:386).  It is psychologically implausible because once we allow that empirical influences can affect whether or not an agent has a good will, there is no reason to think that the careful application of deceit and coercion is less likely to promote a good will than letting someone proceed along their amoral paths without interference.  (Incidentally, the extent to which these kinds of psychological calculations and manipulation must be allowed on a good will reading of FH seems to me to be very good evidence in favor of a more minimalist reading.)

The third argument seems to me to basically have the right structure, and I agree that it will probably imply that one must accord some level of respect and concern for both cute[17] animals and people who lack good wills.  But the problem with the third argument is that this respect/concern is wholly contingent on the particular inclinations of the good wills that make up Dean's kingdom of ends.  On Dean's account, there is nothing about having a good will that requires that one care about other (non-good) people or animals.  It is just lucky for those people and animals that there are people who happen to like them; otherwise, there would be nothing that would lead otherwise indifferent good wills to give respect to anyone lacking a good will.  And that just makes respect for others a bit too contingent for my tastes.  This might just be a matter of what Dean calls "different intuitions," but here I suspect most readers would share my intuitions.

Of course, Dean cannot argue that good wills must treat all human beings (or even all free choosers) with the respect due to ends in themselves.  Dean sometimes makes this strong claim, as when he claims that "Kant offers several reasons for thinking that we ought to treat all minimally rational beings as if they are incomparably valuable ends in themselves" (89).  But given Dean's "fundamental point about value, … that value is conceptually dependent on rational choice, rather than the reverse" (45), to say that one is rationally required to treat something as though it has unconditional value is precisely to say that it does have unconditional value.  So if Dean's arguments are successful that we ought to treat all minimally rational choosers as if they are ends in themselves, then, on his account of value, he has proven that the minimalist reading of FH is correct after all.  But of course Dean does not think that, and thus the requirement that we treat all others as ends in themselves is, and must be, suitably deflated.  Or at least, Dean needs to choose which claim he is more committed to, Kant's fundamental point about value, or Dean's good will reading of FH.

Dean's book is certainly both challenging and stimulating, and there is much in it that I have not been able to address in this brief review.  In the end, I suspect that many readers, and most Kantians, will end up disagreeing with Dean's exegetical and philosophical points.  But regardless of whether or not his argument is ultimately convincing, Dean brings the issue of reconciling the unconditional value of the good will and the value of humanity as an end in itself to the fore, and this should inspire further moral enquiries of a sort that will be good not only for Kantian ethics, but for ethics and applied ethics in general.


[1] See, for example, Christine Korsgaard, Creating the Kingdom of Ends (Cambridge University Press, 2006), p. 123.

[2] One might, of course, see the concepts as identical in one of two ways, either by saying that the "good will" is really just a capacity for virtue (reading Wille here the way Kant will end up using the term in, for example, Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason), or by saying that "humanity" should be identified with a morally good will, i.e., with virtue.  Dean opts for the latter option.

[3] Dean also uses chapter three to introduce "a fundamental point about value, on Kant's picture," which "is that value is conceptually dependent on rational choice, rather than the reverse" (45).  This broadly constructivist or rationalist account of value appears prominently throughout Dean's book, although (as I argue below) it does not sit well with some of his other key claims.

[4] "This is indirect evidence in favour of the good will reading, since it shows that taking 'humanity' as 'good will' can aid in resolving some lingering exegetical questions, and some pressing moral problems" (11).

[5] Dean diagnoses the underlying error of both as that they "take value to be conceptually prior to rational requirements on action" (157), a claim that is particularly odd in the context of Korsgaard, who has made a career of arguing precisely that value is conceptually dependent on criteria of rational action (see, e.g., Sources of Normativity, lectures 2 and 3; and Creating the Kingdom of Ends, chapters 2 and 9).

[6] This argument is not the only argument that Dean makes for his view.  He also claims that it better explains "why we should resolve to act morally" (42), "why we should only permit others' permissible ends" (50), and "the connections between the different formulations of the categorical imperative" (55).  Dean also brings in numerous specific proof-texts to support his reading.  Some of these are initially quite convincing, such as Kant's claim in the Metaphysics of Morals that "a vicious man … by his deeds makes himself unworthy of [respect]" (6: 463), although I found even these unconvincing when seen in context (cf. Wood's discussion of this passage in Kant's Ethical Thought, p. 134).  Other passages seem rather to support interpretations that he rejects (e.g. Groundwork 4: 438, cited in Dean on pp. 69 and 86).

[7] It is particularly striking that Dean, of all people, would be so hasty in his dismissal of alternative readings.  Dean's own view, as he well realizes, is most easily interpreted to imply a rather extreme moralism, and one who treated Dean in the way that Dean treats others might hastily dismiss his view on those grounds.

[8] For brevity, I will refer to this capacity to set ends, with or without additional capacities, as the "capacity for choice."

[9] For a recent account of what it means to value rational nature that fits well with the argument offered here, see Allison Hills, "Rational Nature as the Source of Value" Kantian Review 10 (2005): 60-81.

[10] See too Paul Guyer "The Value of Reasons and the Value of Freedom," Ethics 109 (1998): 22-35.

[11] Of course, in Religion Kant goes further (see e.g. 6:44) and suggests that even for one with an evil "will" (in the colloquial English sense), the predisposition for good -- i.e. the capacity to choose in accordance with the moral law -- is still genuinely "good."

[12] I use the term "wholly good will" in contrast to Dean's good will, which is capable of making evil choices.

[13] See Korsgaard 123.  There is another sense, of course, in which the good will fully realizes the capacity for choice, since only for the good will is one's choice wholly one's own, not governed by contingent inclinations (see Korsgaard 166 and Patrick Frierson, "Character and Evil in Kant's Moral Anthropology," Journal of the History of Philosophy 44 (2006): 623-34).

[14] In one other place, Dean explicitly addresses Korsgaard's argument, but his response to her there is even less convincing.  After quoting Korsgaard's claim that the conflicting passages can be reconciled by noting that the good will completes and perfects the will itself, Dean remarks:

But this reconciliation is not viable.  If the power of choice is an end in itself, then every minimally rational agent is necessarily an end in herself.  If having a firm commitment never to act contrary to duty is a necessary condition for something being an end in itself, then it is at least theoretically possible that some minimally rational agents will not be ends in themselves.  For all that has been said so far [this occurs early in the book], it is possible that the best reading of 'humanity' is Willkühr.  But what is not possible is that two inconsistent readings of 'humanity' -- as Willkühr and as 'good will' -- are simultaneously the best readings. (28)

[15] Here it is worth noting two aspects of Dean's view that force him to confront the same problem of apparently supporting evil decisions that a minimalist conception of the good will faces.  First, Dean insists that even good wills "will be far from morally flawless" (99).  Second, Dean insists that "not just end-setting for moral reasons … [but] all end-setting of a properly ordered will" is valuable (83, see too 122, 125, 140).  Given that good wills are not perfect, they will, at least sometimes, set morally impermissible ends.  And then Dean needs a way of saying that even though we must value the end-setting of the good will that sets these ends, we need not value the ends themselves.  So Dean will be forced to articulate a distinction between valuing a will and valuing its particular ends much like the distinction on which a minimalist account depends.

[16] Dean rightly points out that Kant does not think that human beings can ever know that they are morally good, but he cites only two passages (6:20 and 6:474), both of which are ambiguous at best, in support of the claim that we cannot ever know whether a person is evil.  (For my extended discussion of 6:20, cf. Freedom and Anthropology in Kant's Moral Theory, pp. 104-8.)

[17] I add "cute" because the value of animals is dependent upon the contingent cares of good wills, and there seems ample evidence that if most human beings have good wills (as Dean claims), then good wills, in general, seem to care a lot more about cats, dogs, and baby seals than about suckerfish and stinking corpse lilies.