The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding

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Kvanvig, Jonathan, The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding, Cambridge, 2003, 232pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521827132.

Reviewed by Wayne Riggs, University of Oklahoma


There has been a spate of recent work in epistemology questioning some of the fundamental assumptions about the values that underlie epistemological theorizing. One of the most fundamental of these assumptions is that knowledge is always more valuable than mere true belief. This was considered so obvious for so long that it had hardly been questioned and virtually never been defended, at least not recently. But in The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding, Jonathan Kvanvig builds upon his earlier work to argue persuasively that accounting for the value of knowledge is much more difficult than had been assumed, and might even be impossible.

Kvanvig sharpens his point by arguing that this “value assumption” is at the core of our concept of knowledge. In other words, if someone’s theory of the nature of knowledge is not at least compatible with a plausible account of the value of knowledge, then that theory is prima facie inadequate. Epistemologists have long been focused on the need to develop a theory of knowledge that respects our strongest intuitions about the nature of knowledge. So, they worry about counterexamples that would show that their criteria for knowledge are either too strong or too weak to capture just the right cases as instances of knowledge. But Kvanvig shows that they must worry about another strong intuition about knowledge—that it is always more valuable than any belief that falls short of knowledge. This places novel substantive constraints on theories of knowledge.

Kvanvig poses his project as an attempt to answer what he calls “the Meno Problem” (MP hereafter). In the Meno, Socrates wrestles with the problem of explaining why knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief, noting that either will serve one’s practical purposes equally well. Kvanvig generalizes this to the problem of accounting for the value that knowledge has which exceeds the value of any of its subparts. If knowledge is to be worth pursuing and theorizing about, then it must have some value over and above anything that partially comprises but falls short of knowledge. Otherwise, we’d care only about the valuable subparts—so Kvanvig argues.

He structures his book around the different sources from which one might try to derive the value that knowledge has above and beyond the value of its subparts. Chapters 2-5 attempt to account for the value of knowledge in terms of its components. Chapter 2 argues for the value of true belief, and thus that knowledge is valuable at least insofar as it implies true belief. Having established the contribution of true belief to the value of knowledge, Kvanvig explores in Chapter 3 the value that the third condition for knowledge, justification, might provide. He first considers externalist theories of justification, particularly reliabilism. He argues that the property of being produced by a reliable process cannot add value to a true belief because the value of the reliability is “swamped” by the fact that the belief is “already,” so to speak, true. In the end, he concludes that only a strongly internalist, subjectivist notion of justification can provide any additional value to true belief, so increasing the value present among the components of knowledge. (More on this below.) However, the venerable Gettier literature has shown that knowledge is not identical with justified true belief. Thus, merely to show that justified true belief is more valuable than true belief is not yet to solve the MP.

Chapter 4 examines a tack that a reliabilist theory of epistemic justification might take that would avoid the “swamping problem,” which eliminated “reliability in getting to the truth” as a source of additional value for true belief in chapter 3. In particular, he argues that “virtue theories” that pose reliability conditions for knowledge can appeal to the intrinsic value of epistemic normativity, which supervenes on virtuously reliable traits of the cognizer. In the end, Kvanvig agrees that virtuous true belief is more valuable than mere true belief. Thus, he acknowledges the epistemic value of true belief, internalist-subjective justification, and now virtuous belief. Yet again, the Gettier problem undermines this as a solution to the MP. Knowledge is not identical to virtuously held true belief either, as shown by numerous Gettier cases.

Kvanvig addresses this head-on in Chapter 5, in which he attempts to find additional epistemic value in some property that would immunize justified true belief from Gettier cases. This is an important chapter in terms of Kvanvig’s overall strategy. As we have already said, Kvanvig admits that several potential subcomponents of knowledge are valuable. But Kvanvig insists throughout the book that this is not enough to solve the MP. If, say, justified true belief + some anti-Gettier provision is the correct account of knowledge, then justified true belief + some anti-Gettier condition must be more valuable than mere justified true belief. Otherwise, it is not knowledge that holds such unique value for us, but rather justified true belief. So at this point, the attempt to find the value of knowledge depends upon demonstrating that some possible anti-Gettier condition has value that is not swamped by the value of the other subcomponents of knowledge.

Kvanvig’s prognosis for this attempt is dim. He canvasses all the major proposals for such properties, and finds none that can provide any value for knowledge that is not already had by some other component. But more generally, Kvanvig points out that the attempt to solve the “Gettier problem” has a built-in tension. As the properties proposed to immunize justified true belief from Gettier cases necessarily become ever more complex and ad hoc, they perhaps come closer to yielding a counterexample-free theory of knowledge. In other words, they get closer to providing an adequate account of the nature of knowledge. But, at the same time, the complexity and ad hoc nature of these proposals makes it hard to find the proposed properties intuitively valuable. (E.g., what is more valuable about a justified belief that has no undefeated defeaters over and above a justified belief that does? It begs the current question simply to say that the former counts as knowledge whereas the latter does not.) Kvanvig concludes that the closer one comes to getting the nature of knowledge right, the harder it becomes to account for the added value of knowledge over its subcomponents.

Kvanvig considers a few more attempts to solve the MP, but none are any more successful than what we have already considered. This brings Kvanvig to the brink of concluding that there probably is no solution to the generalized Meno problem he has been addressing. However, he steps back from the brink to suggest that perhaps the problem is one of translation. Perhaps the word that is typically translated as “knowledge” in the Meno is better translated into contemporary philosophical idiom as “understanding.” There is, indeed, some controversy about this matter among philosophers of ancient philosophy. How, though, is this supposed to help solve the MP? It will only if understanding is uniquely valuable in a way that knowledge turns out not to be.

Kvanvig spends the last substantive chapter of the book describing and defending a notion of “understanding” that might plausibly have such a unique value and which is sufficiently distinct from knowledge not to be susceptible to the problems elucidated in the previous chapters. According to him, understanding amounts to the possession on the part of the epistemic agent of “a body of information together with the grasping of explanatory connections concerning that body of information” (200). This requirement is both subjective and objective. It is subjective because of the “grasping” component. It is not enough for there to be merely logical or evidential relations among one’s beliefs. One must have a certain kind of cognitive awareness of these relations. But some of the traditional worries about coherence theories of justification are blunted by requiring that the information be, at least predominantly, true. Thus, the requirement has an objective component as well.

But why should we think that a coherence theory of understanding will be any more successful than the several coherence theories of epistemic justification, each of which has widely recognized flaws? The trick here is Kvanvig’s argument that understanding is not a species of knowledge, and thus not subject to all the requirements that knowledge is. In particular, understanding does not have to be immunized against Gettier cases. Understanding is not incompatible with luck in the way that knowledge is. To make this case, Kvanvig invites us to consider Swampman, a creature who, improbably, comes into existence as the result of lightning striking a roiling mass of swamp gases. Assuming that such a creature came to be with a “body of information together with the grasping of explanatory connections concerning that body of information,” Kvanvig asserts that Swampman has understanding of that body of information. This despite the fact that the extreme unlikelihood of Swampman’s sudden existence and possession of true belief renders it impossible that any of its true beliefs count as knowledge. Thus, we need specify no further property of understanding to eliminate the Swampman case from counting as one in which there is understanding present. If this is correct, then we have some reason to think that an adequately fleshed-out version of Kvanvig’s account of understanding might constitute sufficient conditions for understanding. If such understanding is valuable, then it looks as though we have an epistemically desirable property that is a close cousin of knowledge, but whose value above the value of its subparts is perhaps more explicable.

This positive account of Kvanvig’s of the idea of understanding is necessarily sketchy and represents more of a call for further exploration than a final account in itself. Many questions remain and promissory notes are left to be cashed in. Surely, a much more detailed account of “grasping explanatory connections” is necessary before we can be confident that such a view of understanding really does evade the kinds of criticisms Kvanvig levels so successfully against theories of knowledge. But I do think that Kvanvig has given us solid reasons to take such a position seriously and to pursue the questions he leaves open as a legitimate extension of the kind of epistemology that we have been doing all along.

I promised above to provide a bit more detail on Kvanvig’s argument that only a “strongly internalist, subjectivist notion of justification can provide any additional value to true belief.” This is somewhat complicated, but it is also one of my favorite parts of the book because Kvanvig uncharacteristically (for an epistemologist, I mean), pays fairly careful attention to the details of the value theory that underlies the relevant epistemological claims. For example, Kvanvig argues, perhaps at greater length than is strictly necessary, that the property of being produced by a reliable process cannot add value to a belief that is true. If my belief is true, I do not value it more simply because it was produced in a way that also makes it “likely to be true.” Thus, in Kvanvig’s terminology, the value of being reliably-produced is swamped by the value of being true. This means that the property of being epistemically justified cannot add value to true belief if it is explicated in terms of reliability.

After rehearsing several arguments to this effect made by Richard Swinburne, Linda Zagzebski, and others, Kvanvig gets to the nub of the matter by pointing out that the value of being reliably-produced is derivative from the value of true belief. More specifically, the value of being reliably-produced is derived instrumentally from the value of true belief. A reliable process is valuable precisely because it is instrumental to the production of a further good—in this case, true belief. This is one way for one kind of thing (a belief-producing process) to derive value from another thing (the end of having true beliefs). And it is because reliability derives value instrumentally from true belief that such value is swamped by true belief.

After rejecting the possibility of epistemic justification having intrinsic value, Kvanvig makes the point that there are other varieties of extrinsic value than just instrumental value. Or, to put the point slightly differently, there are other ways of deriving value extrinsically from a valuable end than to do so instrumentally. This opens the possibility that a different theory of justification might be able to derive value extrinsically from the value of true belief without being subject to the swamping problem. Here is where Kvanvig finds the promise of internalist, subjectivist justification. He couches his argument in terms of means and ends, a terminology best suited to discuss the transmission of value instrumentally from the ends to means that effect those ends. Though he doesn’t quite express it in this fashion, Kvanvig is essentially making the point that another way for something to derive value from a valuable end is to “aim at it” or be “directed toward it.” We find no difficulty in ascribing value to, say, a motive in terms of the end toward which it is directed. This is so even if the motive is unlikely to result in achievement of the end toward which it is directed. Internalist theories of justification tend to incorporate just this sort of relationship between the believer and the truth. So long as one is trying hard to get at the truth, one’s cognitive efforts are valuable in a particular way, even if they patently fail to get one to the truth. That is the lesson of evil-demon worlds and brains-in-vats.

This distinction invites a whole array of interesting questions about the nature of the bearer of value in this case as well as the means of transmission of value from true belief to whatever is valuable by virtue of “aiming at” it. (What is supposed to be doing the “aiming?” Is it the person, the belief, the cognitive system, or what?) Epistemologists are tragically ambiguous about these matters, and Kvanvig, though he makes admirable headway, still says less than one (at least this one) might like.

Kvanvig’s book is important for both its negative and its positive accomplishments. His systematic search for the value of knowledge is rigorous and comprehensive, which renders his negative verdict plausible, despite its novelty and surprise. His positive account of understanding, while incomplete, is nevertheless a promising start for those convinced that there is more to epistemology than knowledge alone.