The Value of Living Well

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Mark LeBar, The Value of Living Well, Oxford University Press, 2013, 356pp., $74 (hbk), ISBN 9780199931118.

Reviewed by Gregory Mellema, Calvin College


This impressive volume sets out to show that eudaimonism, the idea that all of our reasons for action are for the sake of living well, coupled with an appropriate theory of the virtues, is a promising and plausible framework for understanding the nature of rationality, norms, and values. Inspired by Aristotle's model of practical rationality as a hierarchy of ends, LeBar refers to his contemporary form of eudaimonism as Virtue Eudaimonism (VE).

Fundamental to the characterization of practical rationality offered by VE are ends and end-seeking. To have ends is to have reasons for action. According to VE, we have reasons for action in virtue of our ends and only of our ends. Some of these ends are final ends (whose normative force does not derive entirely from their instrumental relation to further ends they serve). At least one of these final ends derives none of its normative force from a further end. And there is one and only one Ultimate End that contributes normative force to all other ends we seek. That Ultimate End is living a good life (eudaimonia). LeBar notes that conceiving of the nature of our Ultimate End is an issue that galvanized philosophical discussion from Aristotle through the Hellenistic period, and until the advent of modern philosophy.

The eudaimonistic conception of well-being places practical wisdom squarely in the center of the good life. Reasoning is the activity characteristic of human life. We crave reasons, not just for acting but for self-understanding and for understanding those with whom we engage socially. At this point virtue enters the picture. The operation of practical wisdom is not a sequence of isolated judgments. But because virtue is a "firm and unchangeable" condition of character (82), the product of its interaction with practical wisdom consists of stable patterns of dispositions to see the world in a certain way and respond accordingly. The life it is best to have is one that is directed by practical reason and in which the world is at least somewhat cooperative in providing external goods.

Rationality shapes what counts as a good life for human beings in several ways. Practical wisdom sets the ends that provide the framework for planning and intentions to act. It makes particular judgments as to what conduct is required in particular situations. It directs our conduct so as to train and habituate the passions. And it shapes our social lives in ways that are reflective of our rational capacities. Deliberation might well occur in any of these areas, but it need not. Some wise and virtuous persons might live good lives without much reflection at all on reasons for acting. What is required is that, counterfactually, should they engage in reflection on their choices and plans, these would pass reflective muster.

Distinct individuals can share ends. When I choose to love my friend, I make his good my end. In this way his good becomes a constituent part of my good, not just something of instrumental value to my good. Caring for another for his own sake requires seeing him as an agent standing in an internal relation with his own good life (more on this point in what follows).

The norm for success in the exercise of practical rationality is how well it realizes its aim, namely, a good human life. In addition, a good human life is one that is directed by practical wisdom. LeBar admits that there is a type of circularity here, but he argues persuasively that the circularity is not vicious. He describes the relationship between a good human life and the exercise of practical reason by saying that they are joined at the hip.

A key feature of the norms of practical reality is what LeBar calls constructivism. It is the notion that our true normative practical judgments represent a normative reality together with a denial that that reality exists independently of our exercise of practical judgment (recognitionalism is the view that such reality exists independently of our exercise of practical judgment). He insists that the version of constructivism he defends is a form of realism because there is a "normative reality" which our true normative judgments represent. Thus, such judgments have representational contents: they purport to represent such content distinct from the judgments themselves and to covary with changes in that content. The normativity that we need in understanding how we can best live, however, cannot be thought to be waiting in nature for us to recognize it.

The standard for correctness in deliberative practical agency is the fittingness of one's action to prevailing conditions. We succeed when our judgments and conduct reflect a fitting response to the particular conditions in which we act. The notion of the fitting can be said to be at the core of Aristotle's practical philosophy, LeBar believes. More specifically, we succeed in our practical judgment when we correctly apprehend what elements of our environment are relevant to our action in response, judge a response to be fitted to this conjunction of elements, and do so in a way that is congruent with living a good human life. We are practically wise when these conditions are met.

The fitting relation LeBar takes to be primitive, incapable of analysis into simpler or more basic notions. A judgment that some particular action is fitting as a response to some particular conditions typically results in motivation and action, but it does not necessarily do so. The relation between virtue and fittingness can be stated as follows: the virtuous person sees reasons for acting where the non-virtuous person does not, because, unlike the vicious person, the virtuous person has habituated a sensitivity to conditions to which good judgment is fitted.

A determination of which ends to pursue and when to pursue them is the work of judgment. We have one Ultimate End -- living well -- and adjudication needs to take place among conflicts between various final ends. Fitting judgment is inextricably bound up with end-seeking. Norms for practical wisdom, then, are established by the fittingness of action to conditions of action and, ultimately, to the living of a good life.

Fittingness is not the only norm for success in practical rationality, however. The supervenience of the normative on the non-normative is also essential to such success. A set of properties A supervenes upon another set B just in case no two things can differ with respect to A-properties without also differing with respect to their B-properties. The basic idea is that we justify or criticize judgments in part by reference to a standard supplied by supervenience. The wise judgments we make determine what normative responses supervene on those conditions, in the sense that the fittingness of a response to a set of conditions with certain features necessitates the fittingness of the same response in any other case in which those features are all and only the relevant conditions. One might say, in reference to constructivism, that our judgments establish a supervenience relation. Supervenience helps us understand ethical disagreement, because much disagreement involves disputes over which natural properties are relevant to certain kinds of cases. The concept of supervenience is present even in ancient ethical theory: "Paul Woodruff has argued that supervenience is the test to which Socrates submits the views of his interlocutors" (also, Aristotle, according to LeBar, uses the language of supervenience explicitly) (221).

Publicity-as-intelligibility forms (with supervenience) a second kind of constraint on what can count as a successful or wise practical judgment. Successful or wise judgments create reasons that pass the test of publicity. Your end is perfectly intelligible, and thus public, because while I do not share your end, I have an end of precisely the same type. I too wish to live well. Thus, while fittingness involves normative governance from the deliberative or internal standpoint, supervenience and publicity are the criteria of success in the critical or external standpoint.

Values have a place in the real world because there are agents capable of reflective rationality and normative attitudes; without these capacities, the world would be bereft of value properties, though not of the things to which we stand in valuing relations. To say that X has value for S is to say that X is the object of response R from subject S under conditions C. Our wisely chosen ends construct the facts about what we have reason to do. These facts and values are not "out there" waiting for our discovery or recognition, but products of the very exercises of practical wisdom through which we determine how to act and live.

The conceptual structure of Value Eudaimonism is coherentist. The twin normative ideas of eudaimonia and practical wisdom underwrite all reasons for action (together with the theoretical structure which posits such reasons); VE is coherentist in that those elements are interdependent. We appeal to the idea of practical wisdom to explain what living well consists in, and we appeal to the idea of living well in understanding what forms of practical judgment count as successful. If all we could say about practical wisdom is that its aim is a good life, and if all we could say about the notion of a good human life was that it was a life earning the endorsement of practical wisdom, the circularity would be uninformative. Fortunately, this is not the case. As Mark Johnston puts it, the two "take in each other's washing," but there is no vicious circularity.

Although our ultimate end is living well, and it is for the sake of living well that we do all that we do, that will rarely be the right answer to a demand for justification for why we do what we do. The justification will require sensitivity to more localized concerns, to fittingness to much smaller sets of conditions of action than the context of an entire life. Suppose Socrates saves his wife from drowning. In acting virtuously he always acts for the sake of his own good life, but there is nothing in doing so that prevents him from acting for the sake of his wife. Final ends other than the Ultimate End carry justificatory weight in their own right. We perform the actions we do for their own sake, even while we also do what we do for the sake of something further. VE, then, can make sense of our respect for others in ways that flow from our interests in living well.

Two elements of this book are noteworthy. First, the scholarly work underlying the discussion is rich and substantial both in referencing writings from ancient philosophers and from contemporary philosophers. LeBar cannot be accused of taking shortcuts in the scholarly preparation of this volume. Second, the argumentation he presents is well thought out, and his opponents' positions are nearly always treated with respect and appropriate consideration. His arguments are frequently complex and finely textured, and the differences between his own views and those of his opponents are at times somewhat subtle. Following these arguments is not always easy, but the conscientious reader will be struck by the care that has been taken in formulating them. Those who follow the discussions in recent meta-ethical literature will also be struck by the originality and creativity of LeBar's contributions to them.

LeBar's chapter on constructivism will be of particular interest to those who follow recent work in meta-ethics. The constructivist doctrine he articulates and defends is more compelling than any sort of ethical constructivist theory I have encountered. Whether others have similar reactions remains to be seen, but his discussion of constructivisim is now definitely part of the conversation.

As far as critical commentary is concerned, I offer two brief observations. The first concerns a claim by Onora O'Neill that ethical constructionism is anti-realist. LeBar quotes her (116) as defending this claim by denying that there are any distinctively moral facts or properties, whether natural or non-natural, which can be discovered or intuited and which provide the foundations of ethics. LeBar then charges her with conflating (i) whether there are moral facts or properties and (ii) how we should understand our relationship to them if there are such. In a footnote he observes that Christine Korsgaard consistently opposes constructivism to realism for precisely this reason, thereby committing the same conflation.

Now perhaps a case can be made that O'Neill and Korsgaard are guilty of this conflation. The problem is that he fails to explain how this is true. On the basis of the passage he quotes from O'Neill it is far from clear that she is guilty of conflating (i) and (ii). Certainly the reader is entitled to an explanation, and certainly O'Neill and Korsgaard deserve better.

In one other passage LeBar is guilty of making a pivotal claim without a word of explanation, and in this case the claim in question is controversial. He offers the following: "it makes no sense to think that a property exists when it is not instantiated" (260). It is a view widely held by metaphysicians, many inspired by the work of Roderick Chisholm, that a distinction can be made between the existence of a property and the instantiation of a property. To these philosophers it makes perfect sense to hold that a non-instantiated property nevertheless exists. Perhaps LeBar has reasons to think otherwise, but he fails to indicate what these reasons are. In the absence of articulating such reasons, asserting that it is nonsensical to think that uninstantiated properties can exist seems cavalier.

This is an exceptionally fine book, all things considered. I recommend it highly to those interested in Aristotelian ethics, and I consider it essential reading to those who follow and participate in recent discussions in meta-ethics.