The Value of Rationality

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Ralph Wedgwood, The Value of Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2017, 256pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198802693.

Reviewed by Ali Hasan, University of Iowa


Ralph Wedgwood’s book is the first installment of a trilogy, to be followed by The Rationality of Belief and The Rationality of Choice. It is a rich volume that offers an ambitious, general theory of rationality and its value. On Wedgwood’s view, rationality is a matter of coherence, in a broad sense that includes not only relations between beliefs or credences, but also between other sorts of mental states or mental events, e.g., between beliefs and sensory experiences. Rationality is a value. It is distinct from other sorts of values or norms at least in that it is an internal standard — rationality supervenes on what is in the mind — and a constitutive standard: “all thinkers have at least some disposition to conform to the most basic requirements of rationality, simply in virtue of their counting as thinkers at all” (202). As an internal standard, rationality is in the service of an external “aim” or standard of correctness. Wedgwood takes there to be a single, core normative concept of rationality, which can be applied to different “ways of thinking”: e.g., to beliefs and judgments in the theoretical domain, and to intentions and choices in the practical domain. For beliefs and judgments, correctness is a matter of truth or accuracy; for intentions and choices, it is a matter of the “practicable good.” The plan for the second and third installments is to elaborate on and defend this view of rationality in the theoretical and practical spheres respectively, but much of the groundwork and main contours are already present in the first book.

There is much to like about the volume. It promises to provide something of a holy grail in the philosophy of rationality: a unified account of rationality, applicable to both the practical and the theoretical domains, that preserves and explains internalist intuitions while also accepting a strong connection to the external “aim” of truth or the good. It brings a number of different debates that have largely — though not entirely — been pursued independently into a conversation with each other, including debates in metaethics, traditional epistemology, and formal philosophy (formal epistemology and decision theory). It investigates the interconnected debates on rationality in a clear and careful way, and develops a sophisticated account with important implications for each of these areas. The book can be a challenging read, largely in a good way. It is guaranteed to make you think hard about fundamental questions and puzzles regarding the nature of rationality. Readers familiar with one of the above areas or debates but not others might wish for a bit more guidance and background here and there. But there is something for everyone interested in rationality in this rich book, and many chapters can be read independently, depending on one’s interest.

Chapter 1 presents some prima facie support for the claim that rationality is normative, and introduces a number of challenges to this claim that are addressed in the rest of the book: (i) the possibility of cases in which irrationality is rewarded (e.g., by an eccentric billionaire); (ii) the apparent possibility of a false but rational belief about what one ought to think; (iii) the fact that rational requirements seem to violate that “ought” implies “can”; and (iv) that if rationality is a matter of coherence then it is not clear why it should matter — why it is any more than a “pretty pattern” in the mind.

Chapter 2 addresses the first two problems. (i) The first is handled by distinguishing the “right kind of reason,” as applied to some way of thinking A (e.g., a belief or choice), from the “wrong kind of reason” applied to A. For Wedgwood, the difference is that the former is a normative standard that is constitutive of the kind A, whereas the latter is not (52). For example, it is constitutive of being a reasoner at all that one at least be disposed to believe the conclusion of proofs, disbelieve contradictions, etc., but it is not constitutive of being a reasoner that one be disposed to believe something if doing so will make one happy. (ii) The “ought” of rationality is highly subjective, relativized to the agent’s cognitive perspective (59). One could have a false but rational belief regarding an external sort of “ought,” as when one falsely but rationally believes that one ought to turn right to get out of a maze. But if it is rationally required of you to believe that you “ought” in the subjective sense to think or choose something, then (on Wedgwood’s view) we can infer that it’s true — you ought in this sense to think or choose this.

Chapter 3 addresses the third challenge. That rationality is normative does not violate the principle that “ought” implies “can”. A crucial part of the account is that what one “can” think, or what way of thinking is “available,” depends on context. Wedgwood later (in Chapter 6) builds on this to address worries with the demanding rational requirements proposed by formal epistemologists and decision theorists: these philosophers focus on ideal rationality, and in that context what matters is whether the rational way of thinking is metaphysically possible; but in more realistic contexts, what counts as available is typically constrained, and so the rational requirements are weaker.1

Chapter 4 criticizes the popular view that the normativity of rationality should be understood in terms of reasons. Wedgwood argues that there is no single concept expressing the term “reason” but rather many different concepts, none more fundamental than others. Chapter 5 discusses the semantics of “ought,” distinguishing subjective and objective senses of the term, and arguing that the most fundamental normative concepts are evaluative ones that stand for ways things can be good or bad, better or worse.

Chapters 6 through 9 constitute the core of Wedgwood’s positive account. Rationality is itself a kind of value, and more specifically, a virtue (Chapter 6) that supervenes on the mental (Chapter 7). There are in fact three intimately related values here: the value of a rational disposition, such as the disposition to reason well; the value a manifestation of that disposition, such as reasoning well; and the value of a mental state or event that is “abstractly rational” — a state or event of the sort that would result from a manifestation of such a disposition, but that could come about by chance. According to Wedgwood, the distinction between the latter two is the same as that between doxastic and propositional justification in epistemology, and they parallel the Aristotelian distinction between acting justly (or an act justly done) and a just act.

To come finally to the fourth of the above objections, why does satisfying such requirements of rationality as logical and probabilistic coherence matter? (Chapter 8) Wedgwood rejects “Dutch book” defenses of the importance of coherence. And while he holds that norms of rationality are constitutive of the type of states to which they apply, he doesn’t think this explains the normativity of rationality either. Even if I must be disposed to satisfy requirements of coherence if I am to have beliefs (preferences, etc.) at all, that does not explain why I ought (in some sense) to always satisfy these standards.

Wedgwood says that rationality, while supervening on the internal, has an external “aim”: correctness (Chapter 9). That’s why rationality matters and is not just a “pretty pattern” in the mind. Its value is not “free standing” but depends on its relation to correctness. If some way of thinking is rational, that is “good news” about correctness: it “tells” us that our ways of thinking can be expected to do well in terms of securing these external goods. This all sounds very intuitive, but we have to be careful here, for it is not to be taken literally. To say that rational ways of thinking “aim” at correctness is just to say that there is an essential probabilistic connection between these ways of thinking and correctness. One’s current mental states and events give us “news” about the correctness of some particular way of thinking, but this just means (roughly) that our mental states and mental events determine a space of possible worlds, and a probability measure on this space of possible worlds.

How exactly is this space of possible worlds and probability distribution determined? Wedgwood provides only a sketch of the account here. “The intuitive idea is that these internal mental states and events have some connection to the truth (including the truth about the external world) that are essential to these mental states and events,” where the connection is “somehow built into the constitutive essence of those mental states and events” (223). The space of possible worlds for the agent — the epistemically possible worlds — will include only worlds that can be built out of propositions one can think using concepts one has. Conceptual truths, and truths about one’s own current mental states, that are built out of concepts you possess must be true in every world in this space, and so have probability 1; the (ideally) rational state to have is full confidence in these truths. Some propositions are true in most possible worlds, and some true in more worlds than others. For example, most of the epistemically possible worlds in which one has the perceptual experience as of seeing a tree are worlds in which one is seeing a tree, and are not, say, demon worlds. It is less intuitive that such synthetic, merely probabilistic connections would be constitutive of experiences, concepts, and/or beliefs that we have, and there are some significant challenges to the approach, but the details will have to await the second volume.2

As already mentioned, on Wedgwood’s view the value of rationality is not “free standing” but depends on the value of its “aim”: correctness. This makes good, intuitive sense when it comes to practical rationality. But why should we think truth is a value? If we do not literally always aim at truth or have it as a goal, why should we think it has value at all? Unfortunately, hardly anything is said about this in the first book, which is surprising given the importance of this controversial claim for the account. Wedgwood does at one point appeal to the absurdity of Moorean questions like: “I agree that p is the correct proposition for me to believe, but why should I believe it?” (231) But the oddness here has multiple potential explanations. For one, if I earnestly agree that p is true, then it seems I can’t help believing it, and saying I should believe what I can’t help believing is odd, violating “ought” implies “can do otherwise.” Or the oddness might reflect the normativity of rationality rather than of truth, for it is a constraint of rationality that one believe what one takes to be true.

The other concerns I want to raise have to do with the internalist-externalist debate and Wedgwood’s related discussion of “guidance.” According to Wedgwood, the access internalist claims that rational belief requires that the agent have access to all the facts that determine one’s rationality, or all that rationality supervenes on, where access is understood in terms of being in a position to know these facts. Wedgwood argues that this leads to a vicious regress (166-7), and I think he is exactly right about this. However, although he identifies Fumerton and BonJour as access internalists (179, n. 18), Fumerton explicitly rejects the view so characterized, giving an argument very similar to Wedgwood’s own (Fumerton 2001 and 1995, 81). BonJour (2003) states that justification requires access to reasons to think one’s beliefs are true, and although he sometimes characterizes the view in apparently stronger ways, it is, at the very least, controversial to claim that he requires access to all that determines one’s justification. Moreover, for both, the fundamental kind of access is understood in terms of acquaintance or direct, conceptually unmediated, awareness, and not in terms of being in a position to know. Such a view requires a form of access, is not vulnerable to the regress problem raised by Wedgwood, can accept that rationality supervenes on the mental, and provides an explanation why certain mental states are epistemically relevant: they constitute our access to facts that make true, or make probable, what we believe.

For Wedgwood, rationality supervenes on the mental because facts about what is rational must be capable of “directly guiding” one’s thinking, and only what is in the mind can guide one’s thinking. But what is meant by “guidance”? Initially, Wedgwood says that what is essential to each normative concept is a certain guiding or regulative role it plays in one’s reasoning. For example, one might be guided explicitly by the belief that A is better than B (all things considered) by preferring A over B. More commonly, one might be guided implicitly, by a concept. The only example Wedgwood gives here is that one might be disposed to prefer A over B when one has evidence that supports A’s being better than B, without having the explicit belief (47). He later returns to the question of what direct guidance is. He considers the possibility that “some devious neuroscientist . . . manipulated your brain so that you would form a belief in whatever proposition you considered at that time, regardless of whether it was a logical truth or not” (182-3). Wedgwood says “it is a fluke” or “accident” that you believe what is (abstractly or propositionally) rational; guidance requires that it be “no accident that you form this belief in a situation in which it is rational for you to do so” (183). For it to be no accident for you to form the belief in a situation in which it is rational for you, your belief must manifest a general disposition of the right sort — a disposition, applying to some range of situations, to believe the proposition that is rational in the situation. Any reference to being guided explicitly by what you think is rational, or implicitly guided by evidence, disappears. At a fundamental level, it seems there is only a disposition that is (roughly) likely to be reliable in most or all possible worlds.

Given this view of what guidance involves, it is natural to consider apparent counterexamples to the sufficiency of reliabilist conditions, like BonJour’s Norman the clairvoyant (1980) and Lehrer’s Truetemp (1990), tailored to fit the mentalist constraints. Thus, consider Truelog, who has been fitted with a chip that gives him a highly reliable disposition to form very precise beliefs about logical matters, and Truepref, who has a highly reliable disposition to form very precise beliefs about his own preferences. Suppose they have no defeaters for their beliefs. Intuitively, Truelog and Truepref are no better justified than Lehrer’s Truetemp. It is not by accident that they get things right, but from their perspective it is no different than an accident; from their perspective, it is just “dumb luck” if they get things right. Wedgwood does not consider such cases, perhaps because he takes the access internalist view that can accommodate the relevant intuitions here to lead to a vicious regress, but we saw above that not all access internalisms are so vulnerable.

Wedgwood might have good responses to cases like Truelog and Truepref. And he might find other problems with weaker forms of access internalism. I hope that the second book will address some of these matters.

It is important not to overstate the weight of these concerns. They should be taken more as challenges that one should expect to be addressed by the second book than anything like decisive objections to the view. And they do not affect my assessment of the book as a very rich and important work on rationality, and itself a manifestation of the sort of virtue that it is about.


Beebe, James R. (2009). The Abductivist Reply to Skepticism. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 79 (3):605-636.

Bonjour, Laurence (1980). Externalist Theories of Empirical Knowledge. Midwest Studies in Philosophy 5 (1):53-73.

BonJour, Laurence (2003). A Version of Internalist Foundationalism. In Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues, by Laurence BonJour and Ernest Sosa. Malden, MA: Blackwell.

Fumerton, Richard (1995). Metaepistemology and Skepticism. Rowman & Littlefield.

Fumerton, Richard (2001). Classical Foundationalism. In Resurrecting Old-Fashioned Foundationalism, edited by Michael DePaul. Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.

Hasan, Ali (2017). In Defense of Rationalism about Abductive Inference. In Ted Poston and Kevin McCain (eds.), Best Explanations: New Essays on Inference to the Best Explanation. Oxford University Press.

Lehrer, Keith (1990). Theory of Knowledge. Routledge.

Smithies, Declan (2015). Ideal rationality and logical omniscience. Synthese 192 (9):2769-2793.

1 The details of the account here are tricky, and this is one of those places where some may feel a bit more guidance and examples would help. See Smithies 2015 for a similar attempt to treat the formal epistemologist’s requirements of probabilistic coherence as an ideal that ordinary standards of rationality approximate.

2 Since the possible worlds are infinite, we need some probability measure, or some ordering of possible worlds, or else the ratio of, e.g., non-demon worlds to all possible worlds, will be undefined. Wedgwood does not offer a particular probability measure in this first book, but says that there must be some such measure. For more on this problem see Beebe 2009 and Hasan 2017.