The Varieties of Consciousness

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Uriah Kriegel, The Varieties of Consciousness, Oxford University Press, 2015, 285pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199846122.

Reviewed by William S. Robinson, Iowa State University


The guiding question of this book is "How many types of phenomenology do we need to posit to just be able to describe the stream of consciousness?" (6; emphases in quotations in this review are all in the original.) Since several candidates for required types of phenomenology have been put forward, responding to this question requires discussion of many different issues. The author provides explanations of the background for these issues in a way that will make this book accessible to a wide range of readers. His arguments draw on an extensive knowledge of both the phenomenal and analytic traditions, and are presented clearly and explicitly.

Two types of "sensory" phenomenology are uncontroversial, and are accepted at the outset. These are perceptual phenomenology, and the phenomenology of pleasure and displeasure, or algedonic phenomenology. Controversy begins when we ask whether there are broad, irreducible species of phenomenology that are additional to these two. Four candidates for this role are accepted: cognitive phenomenology (phenomenology of judging to be true), conative phenomenology (phenomenology of deciding and then trying), phenomenology of merely entertaining a proposition, and phenomenology of imagining. Several candidates are held to be reducible to previously accepted phenomenologies. Two of these -- emotional phenomenology and phenomenology of moral judgments -- receive extended discussion.

How is it to be decided whether a proposed phenomenology exists, and is irreducible to other phenomenologies? Appealing to introspection naturally comes to mind, but this method is well known to have problems. Kriegel reviews these difficulties, and accepts only a limited use of introspection. His preferred approach is to use arguments that have non-introspective premises of the following forms. (i) We have immediate knowledge that we are in mental state M, and (ii) The best explanation of this knowledge is that M has an introspectible phenomenology. As Kriegel is well aware, arguments of this kind depend on an observational conception of introspection that some readers will find questionable. However, this observational view is not defended here; Kriegel instead refers the reader to some of his other recent work.

A further preliminary of interest concerns what is to count as being phenomenal. The gist of Kriegel's view (suitably refined in 50-53) is that phenomenal properties are those that lead to the rational appearance of an explanatory gap, i.e., to at least apparent non-deducibility of their instances from structural or functional facts, even for reflective and well informed reasoners.

The first controversial case considered is the phenomenology of judging to be true. A key step in the argument for accepting such a phenomenology is illustrated with an example from Balzac's Father Goriot. Balzac tells his readers that everything in the novel is true; but that is part of the content of the novel, and it has no tendency to make us accept the work as anything but fiction. Likewise, says Kriegel, "nothing going on inside the content of a mental act can embody genuine commitment to the truth of what it represents." (43) It is concluded that the commitment to truth can come only from a feature of the propositional attitude taken toward the content. This attitudinal feature is being presented-as-true, and the introspectibility of this feature is held to be the best explanation of our immediate knowledge of which propositions we take to be true.

There is a large literature on the issue of whether there is cognitive phenomenology, and much of it concerns two arguments that are standard in the field. (A typical example appeals to a phenomenological difference between hearing a sentence in a language one doesn't understand, and hearing the same sentence after one has learned that language. The conclusion that is offered to explain this difference is that there is a phenomenology of understanding the meaning of the sentence that was absent earlier and is present later.) These standard arguments are briefly explained here, and are endorsed by the author. Instead of elaborating or defending them, however, Kriegel offers a new argument -- the "Zoe Argument".

Zoe is portrayed as lacking perceptual, algedonic, emotional, and conative phenomenology. However, she retains considerable abilities to process information that arrives through her senses, and to relate that information to her needs and her actions. Zoe is also portrayed as a genius who solves mathematical problems and constructs proofs. She is credited with moments in which she is stuck, and other moments in which she realizes how a proof must go. The latter are held to provide Zoe with a phenomenology, and one that is irreducible, since she lacks the phenomenologies that might have been thought to provide a reduction base for it.

Skeptics about cognitive phenomenology may concede that Zoe has episodes that present a prima facie explanatory gap, but they are likely to think that this gap concerns only the question of how her internal states can be about mathematical truths. Many thinkers will hold that this aboutness can be given a satisfactory naturalistic explanation that does not appeal to cognitive phenomenology. Those who hold that view will also be likely to doubt attributions to Zoe of differences in the "phenomenal intensity" of her episodes. That is, they may allow that at various moments during Zoe's processing there are differences in processing speeds, or differences in amount of neural resources recruited, but hold that there is no reason to suppose that these differences have any phenomenological correlates for Zoe. Such doubts ramify, because (as we shall see) some rejected candidates for irreducible phenomenologies have cognitive phenomenology as significant parts of their reduction base.

An important part of Kriegel's project is to describe, in publicly accessible terms, the phenomenologies that are held to be irreducible. The method here is to assemble statements about surface features of salient cases, and hold that the phenomenology in question is the phenomenology that satisfies some significant cluster of those features. Examples of surface features in the case of cognitive phenomenology include claims that making a judgment involves a feeling of committing to the truth of p, a feeling that p is sufficiently supported by evidence, a feeling of involuntariness, and the feeling of mobilizing a concept.

As in the cognitive case, the discussion of conative phenomenology centers on a putative feature of propositional attitudes. In this case, the feature is being presented-as-good (in the most generic sense of "good"). The existence of such a phenomenology is argued for by considering contrasts. It is held, for example, that a somnambulist might go through the same motions, and have the same perceptual and cognitive phenomenology, as a normal agent. Their overall phenomenologies would, however, differ, and this difference is held to be most plausibly located in the presence or absence of a phenomenology of deciding what to do and trying to do it.

The question whether conative phenomenology is reducible is approached through considering several attempts to reduce it to the perceptual, algedonic and cognitive phenomenologies accepted so far. The stronger of these attempts call forth intriguing arguments about the timing of the feeling of trying. If that feeling were to depend on receiving proprioceptive inputs from muscles, Kriegel argues, it would have to come later than it actually seems to do, and if it were to depend on anticipations of muscle contractions, it would come too early. The latter point brings Kriegel into conflict with William James's embrace of the anticipation theory, which he expressed in the dictum "I will to write, and the act follows". In a most uncharacteristic case of bald phenomenological disagreement, Kriegel finds that this "seems false to our experience". (80)

The descriptive account of conative phenomenology contains a rich discussion of relations among deciding, acting, and trying. The set of surface features available for providing publicly accessible understanding of this phenomenology includes claims that deciding and trying involve an attitudinal feature of presenting-as-good, that deciding has characters of futurity and finality, and that the experience of trying is what is left over when we subtract the fact that motion has occurred from the fact that someone moved.

In contrast to being presented-as-true and presented-as-good, propositions that we entertain are merely-presented. Like the other attitudinal features, this one is taken to have a phenomenology, and the introspectibility of this phenomenology is taken to provide the best explanation of how we can non-inferentially know what we are entertaining. Kriegel further argues that we can entertain the same proposition that we eventually come to believe, and this is regarded as supporting the view that what is distinctive about entertaining must lie in the attitude, and not in the content of what is entertained or believed. However, the contents "p is true" and "p may or may not be true" are distinct -- it is only in the propositional part, p, that they overlap. So, this reasoning is unlikely to be persuasive unless one has already accepted that differences between judging, deciding and trying to do, and entertaining lie in attitudinal features.

The descriptive account of entertaining examines its relations to thinking, judging, believing and desiring. An important issue that arises here is how to think about standing beliefs, which have no phenomenology when they are not being accessed. In response to this problem, Kriegel offers a developed account (inspired by Searle, but greatly refined) of the relations between standing and occurrent beliefs.

The last of the accepted basic kinds of irreducible phenomenology is the phenomenology of imagining. Here, Kriegel follows Sartre in arguing that we know immediately when we are imagining and when we are perceiving, and that knowledge of this difference cannot be reduced to any combination of differences in what we believe or desire. Attempts to explain the difference between imagining and perceiving in terms of intensity of what is perceived or imagined are considered, and are rejected on the ground that we can have very strong imaginations and very faint perceptions, while being in no doubt about which state we are in.

I turn now to the two main cases in which Kriegel argues in favor of reducibility of a phenomenology to previously accepted phenomenologies. Arguments for reducibility require clarifications of the targets for reduction, and the discussions that provide these clarifications are among the most interesting in the book.

In the case of emotional phenomenology, a central question is what emotions are. The James-Lange theory proposed that emotional states are defined by emotional phenomenology, and that emotional phenomenology is exclusively proprioceptive. Many thinkers have held that this theory leaves out an essential cognitive component. For example, it is hard to see how one could be remorseful without believing that one has acted badly. However, Kriegel rejects an analysis that would add only cognitive states with no phenomenology. Instead, he defends a "New Feeling Theory", according to which emotions are defined by their phenomenology, but that phenomenology includes proprioceptive, algedonic, cognitive and conative phenomenologies. These phenomenologies are held to provide an adequate reduction base for emotional phenomenology.

The discussion of moral phenomenology begins with an explanation of the tension between (a) the initially plausible views that (some) moral commitments are objectively true, and that they are inherently motivating, and (b) the Humean view that no mental state can have both of these properties. Kriegel argues in considerable detail that "moral commitments" is an equivocal term. Taken in one way, moral commitments are putatively objective moral claims that may turn out to be false; but taken in another way, they do not make objective moral claims, and are not threatened by challenges to the objective status of such claims. Correspondingly, the phenomenology of objective moral beliefs is fundamentally cognitive phenomenology, where the contents are moral propositions, and the phenomenology of moral commitments that are inherently motivating is emotional phenomenology, which was previously reduced to other phenomenologies.

The book ends with a presentation of Theses on the Phenomenology of Freedom. This material is in an appendix, because the phenomenology of freedom is not claimed to be a basic species at the same broad level as the other accepted phenomenologies. This appendix is an extended study of the phenomenology of release from various forms of captivity, based on the author's own experience and on reports by former slaves, concentration camp survivors, and released prisoners. Despite comparison to compatibilist and libertarian views in the third of the four theses, there is little here for those interested in free will. The phenomenology of freedom is "not a phenomenology of acting freely, or even willing freely, but rather a phenomenology of being free. (206)

This appendix is also concerned to present a method that can be used in many other cases. Attempts to increase the acuteness and reliability of introspection are avoided because they are unlikely to overcome the problem of contamination by knowledge and interests of introspectors, and unlikely to lead to agreement. More success can be expected if we can increase the salience of introspected phenomena -- in this case, by using the contrast between how it feels to be free upon release and how it (recently) felt to be deprived of freedom. A fascinating collection of reports from others is assembled, and some common themes in these reports and the author's own account are extracted.

Many interesting topics and arguments have had to go unexplored in this review. For example, a two-systems view of cognitive architecture, and Gendler's alief/belief distinction are explained and put to good use, and an old question about the "mark of the mental" is given new life. Numerous arguments for alternatives to the author's views are given clear expositions and careful examinations.

Because of doubts about the Zoe Argument and about the inference from direct knowledge of mental states to the introspectibility of attitudinal phenomenology, The Varieties of Consciousness may not bring acceptance of non-sensory phenomenologies to those not already persuaded by the standard arguments. But even those with such doubts will find that this book offers a wealth of clear explanations, important arguments, useful insights, and models for how to approach phenomenological controversies.