The Varieties of Transcendence: Pragmatism and the Theory of Religion

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Herman Deuser, Hans Joas, Matthias Jung, and Magnus Schlette (eds.), The Varieties of Transcendence: Pragmatism and the Theory of Religion, Fordham University Press, 2016, 303pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823267576.

Amos Nascimento, University of Washington, Tacoma/Seattle

Reviewed by Amos Nascimento, University of Washington, Tacoma/Seattle


This collection of essays proposes renewing classical American pragmatism by putting it in dialogue with the contemporary diversity of religious beliefs and practices of individuals and communities. The very title echoes William James's The Varieties of Religious Experience while the content connects "transcendence" with other concepts often used by pragmatists: faith, consciousness, belief, supernatural, community, and others. The editors are German scholars influenced by Karl-Otto Apel and Jürgen Habermas, who offer a different take on American philosophy. The authors focus on a "theory" of religion reflecting the pragmatist emphasis on "practical" life.

The editors' introduction provides a helpful overview of the chapters and adds an important contemporary issue: secularization. They contrast areligious European thinkers who identified a continuum between modernization and secularization with American philosophers who saw "the viability of the sacred or the ideal under the new conditions of rapid industrialization and urbanization" (1). In American philosophy "religiousness is principally characterized by its optional status as a means of self-understanding in a pluralistic universe of various cultural perspectives on reality, and its quality is judged by its contribution to solve problems in the process of individual self-realization" (2). The editors argue that, despite the differences among pragmatists, there is a common denominator in their conceptions of transcendence (3-4).

The collection focuses on three areas: first, on "processes to individualize and naturalize human self-understanding"; second, on the fact that the human being is "interpretation all the way down"; and third, on "the integral relationship between the individual religious consciousness and the community-based symbolic frameworks of its articulation" (4). The first three chapters (by Christoph Seibert, Sami Pihlström, and Christian Polke) rely on James and discuss general methodological questions related to a pragmatist theory of religion. The next four (by Victor Kestenbaum, Matthias Jung, Wayne Proudfoot, and Magnus Schlette) discuss various aspects of John Dewey's philosophy and compare him to other thinkers. The next three (by Michael L. Raposa, Gesche Linde, and Vincent Colapietro) transition to Charles S. Peirce and connect individuality to community while two more chapters (by Hans Joas and Ludwig Nagl) advance considerations about Josiah Royce. The final two chapters (by Herman Deuser and Robert Cummings Neville) address some theological implications of a pragmatist theory of religion. In what follows I provide detailed comments on these clusters.

The first cluster starts with Seibert's "'Pragmatic' Methodology in the Philosophy of Religion: Perspectives of Classical American Pragmatism," which aims to show that "a methodically controlled practice cannot be limited to the field of scientific inquiry." Seibert suggests that thinking, including thinking about religion, must be seen as a form of practical activity that discriminates, connects, and elaborates on the meaning of a situated experience (18-19). This includes confession, prayer, and rituals (24-25). However, Seibert emphasizes the personal/mystical aspect of this process, giving less attention to the communitarian aspects of religious experience, a point also explored in other essays. In "Insomnia on a Moral Holiday: On the Moral Luck, Reward, and Punishment of a Jamesian 'Sick Soul'," Pihlström insists on putting the accent on individual attitudes, but relates this to the reality of evil (32). He highlights the "tragic dimension of pragmatism," interprets meliorism as "a serious attitude toward the reality of evil," rescues James's concept of "sick soul," and insists that James rejected "any theoretical foundation of morality that could be more fundamental than the moral perspective itself" (35). Pihlström also explores the similarities between the ethics of Emmanuel Levinas and James's concept of "sick soul": "Being a sick soul is, moreover, to be fundamentally -- melancholically -- conscious of and concerned with one's -- and generally human -- mortality and finitude" (44). Pragmatism is often connected to meliorism, but Pihlström reminds us that is has a deeply tragic facet.

In "Expressive Theism: Personalism, Pragmatism, and Religion," Polke relates James's philosophy to the Boston personalism of Albert C. Knudson and Edgar Sheffield Brightman. Both positions defended scientific naturalism, conceptual monism, and a personal conception of God (55-57). For James, religious practices reveal the "personal" dimension of experience (60) while for Brightman, there is a personal and finite God who is the ultimate source of value (62-63). Polke suggests that an "expressive theism" would be a less metaphysical way of conceiving of a personal God, a symbolic way in which individuals express their contingent views about the universe (68).

The second cluster is dedicated to Dewey, naturalism and meaning. In "Ontological Faith in Dewey's Religious Idealism," Kestenbaum tries to "address the unseen and invisible through faith," which "may transcend what is evident by the senses" (74). For him, Dewey's idea of a "road of meaning" combines naturalistic views on experience with a phenomenological description of a variety of shades of meaning in matters of faith. Questioning the attempts to reduce Dewey's philosophy to either scientific or aesthetic readings, Kestenbaum argues that that there is an idealist and religious reading of Dewey as well: "Dewey respects and encourages ranges of meaning that are empirically there, as well as those that have not been seized, separated, or partitioned from the unseen and the hidden" (86). Jung agrees with Kestenbaum's "primacy of meaning thesis," but considers this as only a first step to be complemented by three other points: Dewey's views on meaning and truth, qualitative experience, and naturalism. In "Qualitative Experience and Naturalized Religion" Jung reiterates the importance of "meaning" for Dewey and other pragmatists, but highlights a "qualitative human experience" that can be understood as analogous to Wilhelm Dilthey's distinction between Erleben and Erfahrung. For Jung, "every instance of meaning comes about by selectively transforming felt qualities into articulated language and purposeful action" (97). This process shapes the development of worldviews and interpretive frameworks. As an interpretive framework, naturalism is not much different from religion. However, Dewey did not go far enough to realize that naturalism was one worldview among many others.

In "Pragmatism, Naturalism, and Genealogy in the Study of Religion," Proudfoot expands even further the critique of Dewey's naturalism in order to argue that critical, social, historical, and genealogical methodologies in the humanities can contribute to the study of religion as well as the natural sciences. Proudfoot's concern is not necessarily with naturalistic approaches, but with naturalizing attempts that neglect the social and historical conditionings of religion. He then turns to Peirce and Nietzsche (112). For Proudfoot, Nietzsche's genealogy is not contrary to pragmatism, but it paid more attention to the historical dimensions underlying religious practices. Finally, Schlette adds a new dimension to the interpretation of Dewey in ". . . How you Understand . . . Can only be Shown by How You Live. Putnam's reconsideration of Dewey's A Common Faith." Hilary Putnam reconciled his scientific materialist worldview with a religious perspective (128-129) according to three stages: a turn to Dewey's view of religious experience, a discussion of Ludwig Wittgenstein's stress on the "meaning" of religious propositions, and an explicit affirmation of Martin Buber's I and Thou. For Schlette, "Putnam finds in Buber the conviction that cognizing God is not a question of clarifying assertibility conditions of propositions in which God is held to exist but rather of encouraging oneself to a leap of faith expressed in addressing him." (138). Putnam's turn to religion required no conversion, only a belonging without believing.

The third cluster brings Peirce to the forefront and discusses his views on community, semiotics, and interpretation. In "A Brief History of Theosemiotic. From Scotus through Peirce and Beyond" Raposa goes from Duns Scotus's rule that "a sign of a sign is a sign of what is signified" to Peirce's statement that "a sign is determined by its object but itself determines an 'interpretant'" (143). In between these two points, he refers to Augustine, early seventeenth-century Portuguese philosophers in Coimbra, and the French John Poinsot in order to show that the pragmatist treatment of religion in the twentieth century "resonates powerfully" with this long tradition (149-154). Thus, James considered the volitional aspect of a variety of human actions as subject of his science of religions, Peirce conceived of a person as a symbol, and Royce elaborated on a religious "community of interpretation." For Raposa, semiotic truly becomes a theosemiotic in Royce's philosophy.

Linde's "Man's Highest Developments are Social" complements Raposa's points. Starting with Peirce's architectonic classification of sciences in 1902, in which religion appears explicitly as both normative and descriptive (159), Linde traces various moments in which Peirce deals with religion. For Linde, "if this intertwining of the individual and the social, of self and other, is also true for the processes that constitute religion, it will follow that religion is essentially a communicative affair" (161). He provides a systematic account of how this communicative dimension of religion occurs at the individual and community levels: "Peirce sees community as a web of individuals who, taken separately, merely exist, while the community binding them together is real" (171). This certainly applies to the idea of a church -- both the ecclesia visibilis and the ecclesia invisibilis that influence one's conduct. Colapietro expands this argument. In "The Dissenting Voice of Charles Peirce. Individuality, Community, and Transfiguration" he focuses on Peirce's account of the individual self (185). Expressing his notorious anti-Cartesianism, Peirce insists on the uncertainty of individual positions, but still makes room for the individual identity and identification resulting from the teleological function of absorbing and integrating external tendencies, impulses, and desires through feeling -- what Colapietro defines as the "intrusion of secondness" (191-192). To all this, he adds the dimension of transfiguration.

In the fourth cluster, Joas's chapter, "Religious Experience and its Interpretation. Reflections on James and Royce," identifies two distinct roots of the pragmatist theory of religion: James's foundation of empirical psychology of religion and Peirce's semiotics (219-220). Royce connects these two roots and corrects their shortcomings by moving beyond James's idea of an individual relationship to a savior and expanding Peirce's philosophy in order to define a universal Community of Interpretation (225-227). Joas identifies problems in Royce and suggests six possible responses based on James's philosophy. In the end, Joas suggests that only a new generation of pragmatists such as George Herbert Mead and John Dewey offers a more systematic integration of individual and community in a historical and non-teleological way (231). In "Avoiding the Dichotomy of 'either the individual or the collectivity.' Josiah Royce on Community, and on James's Concept of Religion" Nagl explores a similar point in three steps. The first shows how Royce substituted dyads for a triadic theory of knowledge; the second explores Royce's integration of individual and community; and the third discusses whether Royce's model is adequate for an analysis of "highly individualized" life-forms. Nagl argues that Royce's position assumes that "community is an internally differentiated (possible) field of interactive learning taking place in processes of mutual reinterpretation" (239) according to a triadic scheme -- A interprets C to B -- that does not marginalize the human self, but rather articulates it socially by means of a theory of loyalty. Thus, Royce moves beyond James's individualism.

Theology is the explicit subject of the last two chapters, which are more abstract and speculative. In "Pragmatic or Pragmatist/Pragmaticist Philosophy of Religion?" Deuser differentiates two approaches developed by Peirce in his philosophy of religion. He first discusses Peirce's pragmatist theory of religion which defines religious belief in opposition to empirical knowledge (256-257). Secondly, he turns to Peirce's pragmaticism which is "the far more sophisticated application of knowledge about beliefs by the knowing, everyday-acting, and religiously oriented individual" (258). Pragmaticism is concerned with the determination of meaning according to the three-figured categories of firstness, secondness, and thirdness (perception, empirical reference, and intellectual concepts). In the pragmatist view, religion is a belief awaiting for empirical confirmation while in the pragmaticist view it is the perception of something metaphorical, expressed semiotically in philosophical, aesthetic or theological terms (263). Neville's "Theory of Religion in a Pragmatic Philosophical Theology" begins by defining religion as a hypothesis for organizing inquiry: "religion is human engagement of ultimacy expressed in cognitive articulations, existential responses to ultimacy that give ultimate definition to the individual, and patterns of life and ritual in the face of ultimacy" (270, italics omitted). He defines ultimate realities according to five types: "an ontological creative act that creates everything that is determinate and four transcendental traits of anything whatsoever that is determinate" (271, italics omitted). After a detailed discussion of each transcendental trait and their relation to human ways to engage with ultimacy, Neville concludes that a pragmatic theory of religion reveals what is ultimately important in human life and expressed in concrete daily experiences.

The various chapters present a compounded argument for a pragmatist theory of religion that starts with individual belief, adds the dimension of empirical experience, considers the importance of community, makes social interactions compatible with individuality in religion, and includes theological considerations on indeterminate and ultimate realities.

Taking each author in isolation, it is possible to identify some shortcomings, but taken together they complement and correct each other. For instance, Seibert insists on the personal/mystical aspect of transcendence and considers practical forms of intersubjectivity expressed in confessions, prayers, and other rituals that he mentions only en passant. Pihlström corrects this in part and calls our attention to the dimension of tragedy, mortality, finitude and, thus, fallibilism; but he remains bound to individuality. Jung and Proudfoot correct this point by highlighting the importance of "meaning," social contexts, and worldviews. Joas and Nagl show how Royce's ideal typology of communities makes room for various dimensions of individuality.

Yet, the sense of the tragic in Royce remains unexplored. Also unexplored are the explicit theological elements of Royce's interpretation of Christianity. Raposa's suggestion that semiotic truly becomes a theosemiotic in Royce's philosophy is a good point that is not taken up by the other authors. The connection between religion and aesthetics is mentioned briefly by Deuser, but it deserves more attention. Peirce's metaphysics is prompted by "musement," a sense of wonder before the "admirable." Neville insists that religious experience is related to "ultimacy," but it can be derived from musement or intellectual play as well. For example, experiences expressed through rituals and liturgical practices or the individual habit of praying before a group of believers can be interpreted as a form of thirdness that connects individual and community in relation to a shared belief expressed consensually through communicative gestures. Many of the authors have ties to the pragmatic theory developed by Apel and Habermas, who turned to Peirce in order to transform contemporary German philosophy. However, this implicit background is not shared with the readers. Joas mentions this point only briefly. Another implicit element is secularization. This theme is presented in the introduction, but remains under-explored throughout the book. Finally, although the introduction promises to consider the varieties of religious experiences, not all the authors explore this issue. Neither do they all address the various religious practices in multicultural societies.

The collection must be commended for presenting a complex framework for a pragmatist philosophy of religion. As this program unfolds, it would be important to consider how individual religious beliefs, collective ritual practices, real communities of faith, and influential worldviews impact our daily lives today.