The Veil of Isis: An Essay on the History of the Idea of Nature

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Pierre Hadot, The Veil of Isis: An Essay on the History of the Idea of Nature, trans. Michael Chase, Harvard University Press, 2006, 432pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674023161.

Reviewed by Alan Kim, University of Memphis


The Veil of Isis (VI), according to the subtitle, is an "essay on the history of the idea of nature." This "essay" traces, in minute detail and across a vast historical panorama, the evolution of three tropes that have allegedly determined the human relation to nature and to science: (1) nature as having secrets; (2) nature as "loving to hide," as Heraclitus said (B123 DK); and (3) nature represented as the veiled goddess, Isis. This constellation is linked by the common metaphor of unveiling. Hadot divides his book into eight parts and 23 chapters. He is at his most philosophically provocative in the first three parts of the book (Chapters 1-8), which deal with the reception and interpretation of Heraclitus' aphorism. Parts IV-VI -- in which Hadot contrasts two kinds of attitude towards nature's secrets, one technological or "Promethean," the other poetic or "Orphic" -- contain much interesting material but also manifest the main flaw of VI, namely an overwhelming number of references to historical, artistic, poetic, and scientific figures and texts. But while these turned stones testify to his erudition, Hadot's decision to include even the most obscure figures or citations in the main body of the text, rather than hiding them away in the notes (which nevertheless run to nearly 70 pages), makes it very hard for the reader to keep track of his main points. This distracting tendency to reveal all comes to full flower in the last two parts (VII and VIII) that scan the development of the Orphic attitude from the Romantic era to Wittgenstein, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty. VI, in fine, while full of often startling facts and insights, will perhaps be more useful to historians of philosophy (and science and literature) as a sourcebook than as a coherent interpretation of "the" idea of nature -- were such an interpretation even achievable.

In parts I-III, Hadot traces the "fortunes [of Heraclitus' famous formula, 'Nature loves to hide' -- in Greek, phusis kruptesthai philei] throughout the ages." He begins at the legendary moment that Heraclitus "deposited his book… in the temple of the celebrated Artemis of Ephesus," where the goddess appeared as "an idol made of dark wood adorned with various vestments hanging from her neck and chest, the lower part of her body encased in a tight sheath" (p. 1). In this moment, Hadot finds gathered the three threads that he will follow over the next 320 pages.

He begins by observing that the translation of Heraclitus' aphorism -- nature loves to hide -- "in all likelihood never occurred to" Heraclitus himself. Philein may mean here not "to love… ," but "to be accustomed to verb", "to habitually do verb", in this case, kruptesthai. The subject of the verb, phusis, too, is not best translated as "nature." In Heraclitus' time, "it could mean the constitution or proper nature of each thing [as opposed to nature as a whole]… [or] a thing's process of realization, genesis, appearance, or growth" (p. 7), i.e., "birth" or "the process of birth" (p. 8). The choice between these alternatives depends on the proper interpretation of kruptesthai. While it can mean "to hide," Hadot points out it can also mean "to bury." Thus, the phrase may mean either (a): "What causes birth [phusis] also tends [philei] to cause disappearance [kruptesthai]"; or (b): "That which results from the process of birth [phusis] tends [philei] to disappear [kruptesthai]," i.e., "The form that appears tends to disappear" (p. 9). Hadot argues that either of these alternatives would manifest the "antithetical character… typical of [Heraclitus'] thought" (p. 10), so as to express "astonishment before the mystery of metamorphosis and of the deep identity of life and death" (p. 11). (Typically, Hadot then tracks this thought -- in just two pages! -- from Marcus Aurelius to Montaigne and Rilke, as well as Princess Bibesco, Claude Bernard, François Jacob, Jean-Claude Ameisen, and Félix Ravaisson, the last five being doctors, biologists and belletrists perhaps unfamiliar to Anglophone readers.)

Hadot next turns to the aphorism's metamorphosis into its now familiar (if not therefore transparent) form, some 500 years after Heraclitus, of "Nature loves to hide" (p. 17). He argues that this new sense depends on a semantic shift of "phusis," from signifying a "process of growth" or birth to a "personified ideal" (p. 17), from a relative to an absolute sense (p. 18). By this distinction, Hadot just means that in its earliest use, phusis was always "of" something, viz. the thing that underwent birth or growth (p. 18). Later, in the fifth century BCE, it remains relative, but now

often corresponds to the physical constitution proper to a patient, or to what results from his or her birth. This meaning gradually widened… to include the peculiar characteristics of a being, or its primary and original, and therefore normal, way of being: what it is "by birth," what is congenital to it, or again the way in which an organ is constituted, or finally, the organism that results from growth. (pp. 18-19)

In Plato and Aristotle, Hadot argues, we see the "absolute" use of "nature" come to the fore. But the absolute use does not automatically entail a "global" sense, the "whole of the universe," but rather is equivalent, in the first place, say, in Empedocles, "to the natural process or the working of things; in general, the relation between cause and effect, or the analysis of causality" (p. 20). For Plato, too, the peri phuseôs program apparently involves "knowing the causes of each thing, to know why each one comes into existence, why it perishes, and why it exists" (Phaedo 96a) (p. 21). But in Plato, unlike the pre-Socratic "natural historians," nature, "phusis is precisely an art as well, but one that is divine" (p. 22). Hadot indicates the "fundamental importance" to the Western tradition of this notion of nature as artistic or crafting, in contrast to the opposition of nature (as a "blind, spontaneous process") and art (the action of intelligence). In Aristotle, nature is defined as the "principle of inner motion inside each thing" (p. 23), but he opposes art and nature according to their respective external and internal principles of motion and "finality" (Hadot presumably wrote "finalité" -- "end" or "purpose"; the same translation error recurs on p. 106) (p. 24). Thus, nature appears as a more perfect, because "inner" and immediate, art (p. 24), a motif that Hadot again follows down to Schopenhauer and Bergson in our own time (cf. p. 326, n. 22). The Stoics, too, see "nature's operation [as]… completely analogous to that of art within phusis," which they define as "'an artistic fire that proceeds systematically and methodically to engender all things'" (p. 25). It is in the Stoics' identification of nature, the world's soul, and Zeus (p. 26) that Hadot locates the transformation of phusis from "event, process, realization of a thing" to "the invisible power that realizes this event," the "passage from the experience of an event to the recognition of a power or force intimately linked to this event" (p. 26). This enabled, perhaps inevitably, the conception in the first century BCE of nature as a goddess "having" secrets -- the third and second of Hadot's three main tropes, respectively.

The reinterpretation in later antiquity of Heraclitus' aphorism was made possible by a kind of fusion of a much older picture of the gods as secretive, protective of their wisdom, on the one hand, and the personification of Nature, on the other. "Owing to the personification of nature, the difficulty of knowing nature was considered to be somehow explained by the personal behavior of nature, which seeks to conceal itself and is jealous of its secrets" (p. 31). This is the view Hadot ascribes to Latin writers of the first century BCE, such as Cicero, Lucretius, Ovid, and Pliny the Elder. Hadot carefully distinguishes various senses in which nature's secrets are secret. On the one hand, these secrets "correspond to the invisible aspects of nature" (p. 31) that, due to remoteness or smallness, are hidden away from us. Other secrets do appear to us, but inexplicably, since their causes are hidden. Hadot points out the importance of these conceptions of the secret for scientific methodology: for example, if a secret is secret because it is invisible, hidden from sight, like a bodily organ, then

force and violent observation, …  Cicero hints, …  risks disturbing the phenomenon it wishes to study. This was to be a traditional argument of thinkers hostile to experimentation. (p. 32)

On the other hand, earlier Greek thinkers had already formulated an "analogical" scientific method, in which hidden causes can be studied through the phenomena they somehow produce (p. 33).

In a fascinating chapter on "Heraclitus' Aphorism and Allegorical Exegesis," Hadot argues that once the aphorism came to mean "nature loves to conceal herself," this was not interpreted as an expression of our human difficulty in "knowing natural phenomena and in constructing the 'physical' part of philosophy," but rather of the gods' concealment. This is because among early poets, theology (or "discourse on the gods") often amounted to a "primitive explanation of the genesis of things (phusis)" (p. 40). Philosophers in the Platonic and Stoic traditions thus sought for a hidden science "beneath the veil of [poetic] myth," a science corresponding to their own science of nature (p. 41). Thus, for both Platonists and Stoics, Hadot argues, there was a "twofold" physics, involving, on the one side, the "proper" study of the "structure of bodies, the movements, and the causes of natural phenomena"; and, on the other, a part that speaks of the gods, "since mythical traditions and religion place them [sc., the gods] in relation to the phenomena of nature" (p. 44). The method of this "theological physics" is allegorical exegesis, the bringing forth of a poet's meanings hidden away behind veils of words. Hadot here seems to overlook a key point, one that recurs several times (e.g., pp. 47, 48, 51, 53, 55, 58, 62, 80, 205, 251), viz. that the "secret" involved in allegorical exegesis is of a completely different order than the secret of nature itself. The exegete of a poem uncovers a secret doctrine hidden there, not by nature, but by the poet. That doctrine may, but need not have anything to do with nature and its secrets, which latter are of course not doctrines at all, but rather things (say, distant stars or invisible atoms) or processes (say, star formation, digestion, genetic inheritance). Hadot does later mention a possible relation between poetic and natural secrets, in quoting Porphyry, who, in defending the Platonic use of myth against its Epicurean critics, says that the philosopher knows that

Nature hates to expose herself uncovered and naked in view of all. Since she has concealed the knowledge of her being from mankind's coarse senses, by hiding beneath the vestments and envelopes of things, likewise, she has wished that sages should discuss her mysteries only under the veil of mythic narratives. (pp. 53-4)

The rest of Chapter 5, and Chapters 6-8 give further detailed accounts of Neo-Platonic senses of "Nature's occultation," both in the sense of divinity's "wrapping itself up" in bodies and sensible forms (p. 55), and in our own use of mythical language -- occultation demanding the "true philosopher's" decipherment.

After this broad, nuanced, and scholarly discussion of Heraclitus' aphorism and its ancient metamorphoses, Hadot turns, in the midsection of VI, consisting of Parts IV-VI, to more speculative fare: a purported transformation in humanity's attitude(s) towards "nature," or "Being," or "beings," either as cause or effect of the rise of the modern exact sciences. Although he several times makes mention of Heidegger, it is unclear if Hadot is aware of how closely his very theme -- the history of nature's unveiling -- parallels Heidegger's so-called history of Being, and the covering-over of that Being, especially with the rise of modern mathematical natural physics (neuzeitliche mathematische Physik). At any rate, Hadot's painstaking analysis of the so-called Promethean and Orphic attitudes towards Nature's secrets fills in the facts without which Heidegger's contrast of the modern hegemony of high technology against a more primeval "letting-be" remains free-floating and abstract. To be clear: supporting (or criticizing) a Heideggerian interpretation of science is not Hadot's hidden or explicit aim; but it is a salutary purpose to which his rich discussion might be put by philosophers (with some qualifications -- see below).

As Hadot says, ancient philosophers and scientists had several "models of investigation" open to them, each reflective of a different representation of nature and the human, and of nature's secrets. Specifically, he writes:

If man feels nature to be an enemy, hostile and jealous, which resists him by hiding its secrets, there will be opposition between nature and human art, based on human reason and will. Man will seek, through technology, to affirm his power, domination, and rights over nature.

If, on the contrary, people consider themselves a part of nature because art is already present in it, there will no longer be opposition between nature and art; instead, human art, especially in its aesthetic aspect, will be in a sense the prolongation of nature, and then there will no longer be any relation of dominance between nature and mankind. That occultation of nature will be perceived not as a resistance that must be conquered but as a mystery into which human beings can be gradually initiated. (p. 92)

The dominating attitude Hadot calls "Promethean", the aesthetic, "Orphic." While his discussion of the former is illuminating, especially in tracing the continuities between ancient mechanics and magic, on the one hand, and of magic and early experimental science, on the other, it is especially in Hadot's discussion of the Orphic attitude that many readers will discover new and unexpected vistas. Ideologically-minded interpreters of the history of metaphysics, science and technology, whether they see that history as one of progress or long decline, will find in Hadot's account a new alternative and challenge. For the Promethean and Orphic attitudes represent two opposed, yet simultaneous, historical developments, bound together like a double-helix around a single historical axis: the master-metaphor of Nature's secrets. Grand and tendentious philosophical narratives, be they of the Hegelian, neo-Kantian, or Heideggerian variety, necessarily ignore inconvenient facts, sometimes by calling into question their importance vis-à-vis history's "deeper" motion. By contrast, Hadot's attention to the finer grain of fact reveals an intriguing and wholly unexpected dialectic between the technological and aesthetic interpretations of nature: dialectic not as successive sublimations or degradations, but as an unending conversation between two equal partners.

My main criticism here again concerns Hadot's execution of this project, for he simply covers a greater than practicable area, resulting in a certain thinness of treatment. For example, he discusses the Promethean "judicial" approach to nature, forcing "her" -- through magic, dissection, experiment -- to yield up secrets as if torturing forth a confession (p. 93; 120); but he makes no mention of Page duBois' study of just this topic in Torture and Truth (Routledge, 1991) (which, incidentally, includes a discussion of Heidegger and Plato that could be usefully compared to Hadot's discussion of Heidegger and Heraclitus in Chapter 23). Again, when he writes in Chapter 10 on "Mechanics and Magic" that "the phenomenon that characterizes the evolution of our civilization… has been called the 'mechanization of the world'" (p. 105), Hadot crucially misquotes Dijksterhuis' title, thus misconstruing his sense: it is Die Mechanisierung des Weltbildes (1950), the mechanization not of the world but of the world-picture. This oversight is important, not just because it reappears in the title of Chapter 11, but because Hadot is dealing with metaphors, i.e., with "pictures" of nature: it is the picture that changes, not nature itself, and it is in line with this shift in the way we frame nature that our attitudes towards its secrets change as well. (Heidegger, in his essay, Die Zeit des Weltbildes [1938], goes one step further: speaking of the world in terms of "pictures" already betrays a metaphorical mediation, and thus an occultation of the world as it gives itself to us immediately, phenomenologically; another useful point of contrast with Hadot, perhaps.)

Against the Promethean assault on Nature, squeezing forth "her" secrets so as to let man dominate her for his profit, Hadot contrasts the more tender, so-called Orphic approach. The Orphic naturalist also seeks to discover Nature's secrets, but does so "while confining [him]self to perception, without the help of instruments, and using the resources of philosophical and poetic discourse or those of the pictorial arts" (p. 155). Generally speaking, the Orphic approach assumes nature's secrets to be accessible only through "discourse," specifically one that somehow "imitates the artistic game of that poet of the universe, the divinity" (p. 156). (Hadot explores the further, implied assumption of a divine craftsman who makes the world as his poiêma, or song, or book, in Ch. 16; cf. e.g., p. 201.) Hadot identifies Plato's Timaeus as the exemplar of the Orphic approach, since it (re)creates a conjectural, verisimilar model of the world's genesis and structure, one that crucially differs from Promethean technique in being non-experimental and merely discursive.

I am unsure how persuasive I find Hadot's distinction between the Orphic and Promethean approaches as scientific methods. Even he admits that the "discursive" and the "technical" approaches often meet and overlap, sometimes within the same "scientist," say, Plato, Leonardo, or Dürer (p. 155; 158-9, passim). Given that Hadot identifies "conjectural physics" as Orphic, he may have in mind the opposition between "theoretical" and "experimental" science; yet the latter will always operate within a theoretical or "discursive" framework of conjecture, while the former is always dependent on experience, if not experiment, to be more than sheer speculation. In other words, it seems that the Promethean progress of technology and technical intervention in nature always involves a conjectural dimension, such that science and technology cannot be conceived as radically separate. In particular, whereas Hadot finds the endlessness of the adept's initiation into Nature's mysteries distinctive of Orphic "science," it is obvious that the Promethean approach imposes an equally "infinite task" on the technical scientist. On the other hand, Hadot's discussions of Orphic "aesthetic perception" in Ch. 18, and of the notion of a natural hieroglyphic language in Ch. 16, suggest that the Orphic naturalist is less dependent on the Promethean than vice versa. This is because the technical approach cannot do without an implicit "world-view" on the basis of which its interventions even make sense, whereas the contemplative strives precisely to detach himself from the object of contemplation, to see it "purely" -- what Hadot calls "aesthetic perception". Again, had Hadot written a less diffuse work, he may have usefully discussed the scientific pretensions of just such a program of pure perception, e.g. of Husserlian phenomenology, and how it differs or agrees with the Orphic approach. For Husserl, phenomenology is not opposed to "scientific knowledge," but is instead the most rigorous science (strenge Wissenschaft) there is. Hadot might reply that strictly speaking, phenomenology is not, however, a natural science, which is true. Clarifying this point, however, would require resolving an ambiguity in Hadot's notion of the "aesthetic": is this perception necessarily sensible, or some other "higher" species of intuition of a nature behind the sensible appearances? He seems not to have made up his mind: on the one hand, he speaks of discovering the "great laws of the appearance of forms," of nature's "method" (p. 218), while on the next page he quotes painters -- lookers -- such as Shitao and Klee (p. 219); either way, however, the Orphic contemplator could be said to "achieve amazement before the world's beauty" (p. 219).

Hadot turns, in the brief, single-chaptered Part VII, to the identification of nature with Isis and Artemis as a veiled and sheathed goddess with a multitude of breasts (see below). The discussion of Isis/Artemis is chiefly interesting from a philosophical point of view for the use he makes of it in the final Part, entitled "From the Secret of Nature to the Mystery of Existence: Terror and Wonder". Until now, the trope of Nature's secret has assumed a dichotomy between the inner and outer: it is from the outside into the interior that the Promethean must penetrate, while it is the outside "aesthetic" face of nature that the Orphic is content to contemplate. Hadot discusses Goethe's view, in some sense opposed to both the Promethean and Orphic, that "Isis shows herself without a veil" (p. 249). By this Goethe meant that the apparent "secrecy" or concealment of nature was due not to its being covered, but to the weakness of human (in)sight. There is no opposition of the inner and outer: it is just a question of where (i.e., how) we look: "Seek no secret initiation/beneath the veil; leave alone what is fixed./If you want to live, poor fool,/Look only behind you, toward empty space" (Goethe, quoted at p. 249). "Mysterious in broad daylight, Nature does not let herself be robbed of her veil, and what she does not wish to reveal to your mind, you could not constrain her to do with levers and screws" (Goethe, quoted at p. 250; cf. p. 255). As Heidegger will come to say, it is precisely the obviousness of Nature, and the way it consequently comes to be taken for granted, that hides it most stubbornly from our awareness.

In the last 50 pages, Hadot covers a vast territory, one perhaps as rich as that of the preceding 260. Ch. 21, "The Sacred Shudder," discusses how the aesthetic approach "necessarily also … introduc[es] an emotional, sentimental and irrational element into the relation between mankind and nature" (p. 263), in particular the terror we feel in the face of nature's sublimity. As he puts it: "The unveiling of the statue of Isis tended more and more to lose its meaning of discovering the secrets of nature and gave way to stupefaction in the face of mystery" (p. 283). Oddly, speaking of shudders, Hadot makes nothing of the remarkable fact that Nature as the many-breasted Isis (or even more bizarrely, Nature as a many-breasted statue of Isis -- see pp. 238-9) is represented so unnaturally, indeed monstrously: why is Nature presented as a freak of nature?

The way in which Hadot again takes up the shuddering some "Orphics" felt when confronted with the prospect of a naked Nature (or "Truth") in Ch. 22, "Nature as Sphinx," makes me wonder if he did not himself feel a certain urge to avoid the unsanitary. I especially have in mind a rather inexplicable discussion of a passage from Nietzsche's preface to The Gay Science. I can't reproduce the long extract Hadot cites, except to say that Nietzsche here argues that he, like "those Greeks!", wills not to unveil truth: "We no longer believe that the truth is still the truth, if its veils are taken away from it", and that the passage is shot through with sexual insinuation:

"Is it true that the good Lord is present everywhere?" a little girl asked her mother: "But I find that indecent" -- a hint [Wink] for philosophers! One should hold in higher regard the shame [not "modesty"] with which Nature has hidden itself behind riddles and motley [probably not "colorful"] uncertainties. Perhaps truth is a female [Weib -- not "woman"] who has reasons [Gründe] not to let her nether regions [Gründe] be seen. Perhaps her name is, to speak Greek, Baubo?… (Preface to The Gay Science, §4, reviewer's translation)

Now Hadot translates the end of this passage as follows: "Perhaps Truth is a woman who has reasons [Gründe] for not wanting to let her reasons [Gründe] be seen? Perhaps her name, if we were to speak Greek, is Baubo?" (p. 293; p. 285). Hadot then asks: "Yet why does Nietzsche say that Nature is a woman who might have good reasons [Gründe] not to let her reasons [Gründe] be seen, whereas, in the context of modesty [shame], we would have expected to find, instead of the second Gründe, a word designating the female sexual organs?" (p. 293, italics added). Hadot utterly misses Nietzsche's punning double-entendre: the second "Gründe" indeed does have sexual connotations. While I share Hadot's reluctance to accept Marc B. de Launay's translation ("Isn't truth a woman who has good reasons to hide behind, in order not to let her behind be seen?") -- at least in its English rendering -- de Launay nevertheless sees that a pun is involved, though it is not on "behind," but on "Gründe". Hadot's objections are strange:

First, Gründe is plural, whereas "behind" is singular. In addition, to give the German word Gründe the physiological or anatomical meaning of the French fondement is, it seems to me, impossible, all the more so in that it would not be an exhibition of the female sexual organs. I think, for my part, that by means of this repetition, Nietzsche wanted to renounce the metaphor ironically, after he had merely sketched it. The Truth can be compared to a woman, but nevertheless we must not forget that it is the Truth. Nietzsche certainly wanted to surprise the reader, who was expecting a word with sexual connotations, and instead finds only a repetition of the word "reasons" [Gründe]. (p. 294)

The first objection is moot, since de Launay is merely trying to reproduce Nietzsche's pun, not on Gründe at all, but on "hinter" (behind). The second objection is simply obscure to me; but the "repetition" of the word Gründe is a punning repetition: once "reasons," the second time "(nether) regions".

In the last chapter, Hadot argues that the trope of the "secret of nature" has run its course. In Schelling and Heidegger, and then in Sartre and Merleau-Ponty, Hadot locates its offspring: the notion of the "mystery of being," and the terror or even "anguish" that the human feels in its face. While Hadot's treatment of these figures is perhaps necessarily cursory (whole books have been written on Heidegger and the notion of "unveiling"), I would mainly take issue with its very premise, that "in our contemporary world, people no longer speak of secrets of nature, and Isis has gone off, along with her veil, to the land of dreams" (p. 303). Especially now, as science reaches its Promethean apotheosis, the talk of "revealing," "unlocking" or "decoding" the "secrets of the universe" is common fare. Perhaps it would be more accurate to say that as the Promethean attitude has dominated science as well as nature, the Orphic attitude has changed from one of wonder and reverence to anguish and terror -- not at "Nature" (for Isis has fled) -- but at what Promethean man has done to her: made her, at least down here, into a monstrous work of art.