The View from Here: On Affirmation, Attachment, and the Limits of Regret

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R. Jay Wallace, The View from Here: On Affirmation, Attachment, and the Limits of Regret, Oxford University Press, 2013, 268pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199941353.

Reviewed by Alan Thomas, Tilburg University


The central thesis of R. Jay Wallace's fascinating essay in moral psychology is that it is easy, when reflecting on our lives from our current temporal standpoint, to make a mistake in how we think about the past events that have shaped it. Assume that your current life is one that you would affirm as worth living. Suppose also that you look back on certain past events with a degree of ambivalence. They were, you believe, wrong at the time. Yet, they have formed a necessary part of a chain of events that has led to the constitution of your current outlook. You affirm the events in the sense that you do not want them to have been otherwise. This thought excludes the possibility of regretting them, as that is to wish that they had been otherwise. Nevertheless, you also believe that your actions were, at the time, rationally unjustified. Can this combination of attitudes be consistent?

Wallace thinks that it can. He diagnoses a tempting mistake, namely, to think that an inability to regret is, itself, a form of affirmation in a way that excludes the thought that the past action was unjustified. However, for Wallace, affirmation means that while you cannot regret the past action, you can still believe it was unjustified at the time. The standpoint of retrospective assessment is constrained by this fact, such that "we can find ourselves unable to regret actions of ours that were unjustifiable at the time" and "committed to affirming features of our lives and of the world we inhabit that are objectively lamentable". (p. 3) An important thesis that supports the second claim is one Wallace calls an "affirmation dynamic": that we are committed to affirming all the necessary conditions in the past that shape our current standpoint of appraisal. Hence the book's title: all such appraisal is "from here".

That idea -- that our appraisal is situated in a perspective dependent on a range of presupposed contingencies in the past -- is crucial because of Wallace's sympathies with contractualist moral theory and a more local thesis that it supports, namely, "buck passing" about values and reasons. The buck passer thinks that ascriptions of values cash out in terms of reasons for an agent to think and to feel. If those are your commitments, then Wallace's diagnosis of the puzzle cases that he selects for consideration seems problematic. If an attitude of affirmation makes an attitude of regret "unavailable", all well and good. However, how can that claim be combined with another: that the action in the past was nevertheless unjustified? That lack of rational justification would seem, on contractualist grounds, to suggest that in certain cases the past action was not only unjustified but also wrong. We usually take wrongness to be the grounds of justified regret. Wallace's main task in this book is to explain why his general thesis is not, by contractualist lights, vulnerable to a charge of inconsistency. How can a form of affirmation that makes regret unavailable be compatible with the recognition of a lack of justification for past actions that would seem to call for regret?

Wallace's general thesis is illustrated by a range of cases: in the first imagined example -- made famous by Derek Parfit -- a teenager conceives a child for reasons that, at that time, made the decision unjustified given her situation. However, the experience of being a parent "shifts" the woman's standpoint of appraisal so that she experiences the past decision as unjustified, but not as one that she can regret. She can affirm a past decision that was rationally unjustifiable. Wallace believes that, hitherto, attempts to resolve this paradox have involved different frameworks of evaluation or different ways of conceptualizing the same values. So his buck passing approach focuses instead on the relevant "reasons for action and response" on the part of the young mother. (p. 94) Her changed situation means that she has new reasons to love and care for her child that she can affirm while acknowledging the good reasons that she had in the past not to conceive a child so early in her life. For Wallace, if there is an air of paradox about such a case, it is generated by the idea of the impersonal evaluation of an outcome. By focusing, instead, on the reasons grounded on evaluative attitudes, the asymmetry between the reasons at the time of decision and those that feature in retrospective assessment no longer generates a paradox.

Wallace also considers an overtly political case: complicity in injustice in the guise of what he calls "the bourgeois predicament". Given the wretched moral and political condition of the world, many of us in affluent societies are committed to projects that we would like unconditionally to affirm. However, we are unable to do so as those projects seem, on reflection, a form of moral and political self-indulgence. If "unconditional" affirmation involves the affirmation of all the preconditions of a valuable project, then to affirm the projects is to affirm the inequalities and unjust domination that has, historically, made them possible. Wallace's "affirmation dynamic" in this case leads to something that one very well might call alienation: "a rift between ourselves and the larger world in which we live". (p. 7)

In the order of Wallace's exposition these two examples bracket a third that seems to him particularly significant: Bernard Williams's discussion of a fictionalized "Gauguin". Unlike the real Gauguin, Williams's fictional counterpart leaves his wife and family and goes to Tahiti for the sake of his artistic talent and in order to develop it. Williams's explanation of his fictional case is that it involves retrospective justification. Gauguin's inability to regret his past decision from his standpoint as a successful artist is a reflection of a retrospective justification of his morally questionable decision that lies in the past. But a presupposition of Williams's distinctive account is that Gauguin simply could not know what the relevant reasons were that justified his decision to abandon his family at the time when he made it. The subsequent course of events showed whether he was right or not, and that is a matter of resultant luck.

Wallace wants to describe the case differently in a way that he sometimes proposes as a corrective to Williams's explanation. When Wallace's Gauguin looks back from his successful life as a painter, he will be led by the affirmation dynamic to affirm and not to regret his past action, but it is still unjustified and hence wrong. That last point, Wallace thinks, is overlooked by Williams's treatment of the same case.

In order to isolate what seems to me problematic about Wallace's argument overall -- and the Gauguin case in particular -- I think it is helpful to go more deeply into the distinctive assumptions that shape it. First, Wallace's version of buck passing is developed to address a problem that seems to face any buck passer: we make evaluative judgements about past events, yet we cannot now act so as to change them. So much, then, for the postulated reasons for action in the buck passer's claim about the relation of values to reasons. Wallace's solution to this problem is to note that, in addition to recommending actions, the buck passing account also recommends certain attitudes that are constitutive of the engaged standpoint of evaluation. It is not up to you whether or not to feel negative emotions if the object of your attachment is damaged. He believes that while we cannot act towards these past events, it is nevertheless true that a buck passing account can explain retrospectively directed attitudes by appealing to the constitutive role of these emotions.

I think that is a genuine insight, but at this point problems start to emerge because of what Wallace says next. Philippa Foot distinguished reasons that function as evidence from those that function as verdicts. (Wallace prefers to use the terminology of the "pro tanto" versus the "all in".) We can speak of those reasons that contribute to an overall verdict (the pro tanto) or the verdict itself (the all in). Is the buck passer's thesis formulated for the former or the latter? Wallace claims the latter: he believes that if "all in" evaluative attitudes towards past events are to function as verdictive, then they must be unambivalent in a technical sense that he stipulates. His unambivalent verdicts must be "wholehearted". That claim does a lot of work in generating his conclusions. To be verdictive, in the case of attitudes, is to be committed to them in a "wholehearted" way that underpins the mutual exclusivity of Wallace-style affirmation and Wallace-style regret. This mutual exclusivity is essential to his description of the puzzle cases since it explains why "all in" affirmation disables the competing response of "all in" regret. However, his treatment of the relation between the buck passer's basic thesis and the nature of the "pro tanto" and the "all in" as applied to such evaluative attitudes seems to me to cause problems for the stability of his overall position.

On Wallace's diagnosis, in the puzzle cases the dominance of the present perspective (and the working of the affirmation dynamic) means that "all in" affirmation disables the workings of regret: the expression of a wholehearted evaluative attitude of affirmation makes a similarly wholehearted expression of an attitude of regret "unavailable" to the agent. So far, so good. But now the distinctive part of Wallace's account appears: this does not mean that the past event was rationally unjustified (where past wrongness is a special case of lacking rational justification in the past.) The pressing question is whether this past lack of justification, or wrongness, is merely pro tanto. We can drop the qualification in the Gauguin case: the past action was not just rationally inadvisable. It constituted a wronging of Gauguin's family. Does it, or does it not, itself ground an overall verdict?

Wallace carefully goes through his options: the first is to keep the past wrongness of the act merely at the level of the pro tanto. This is a kind of "backward-looking concern with justification . . . . [that] can come apart . . . from the agent's fundamental regrets". (p. 169) It seems to me that this first option, however, is too close to Williams's treatment of the case. Williams could concede that such past wrongness was a pro tanto consideration for Gauguin, perhaps leaving some psychological traces within the current attitude of affirmation, such as the desire to make moral repair. Wallace wants to distance himself from Williams's explanation; yet his criticism of Williams on this score rests on a rejection of the very idea of retrospective justification. Wallace's critique quickly modulates into his next option: that there are, in fact, two verdicts in play here, and we should distinguish "shallow" from "deep" ambivalence.

To see the attractiveness of this option one only has to note why, for a contractualist and buck passer like Wallace, this past wrongness is disabled from generating a verdict and, indeed, "all in" regret. Why should merely being past disable these reasons from playing their accustomed role? After all, in one of the foundational texts for this debate, Nagel's The Possibility of Altruism, the objective reasons of morality pick out intrinsic and timeless values. A past wronging should not be prevented from grounding a current verdict merely because of its temporal location.

Wallace can see the force of that objection and that mere temporal indexing is not enough. So he is tempted to concede the point: the past reasons generate an overall verdict. Now an odd aspect of his view emerges: he has two overall verdicts in play. The verdict of unconditional affirmation makes "all in" regret unavailable by disabling that response; but why does not the past wrongness make it available again (by enabling it) if we concede that it now plays its "all in", verdictive role? Perhaps practical paradoxes are easier to tolerate than paradoxes of belief, but it is at least odd to have one verdict disabling the operation of all in regret and another enabling it. With these two conflicting mandated attitudes in play what exactly is the agent to feel?

Nevertheless, the dual verdict diagnosis does seem one that tempts Wallace when he discusses his own treatment of Gauguin's predicament. His Gauguin, occupying his own temporally indexed standpoint of "current" appraisal, is a morally wracked figure. He oscillates between the two verdicts of affirmation and recognition of the past wronging of his family. He therefore oscillates between the two attitudes mandated by these verdicts. A tragic conflict now tears our fictional Gauguin apart: but now the buck passing approach to mandated attitudes, which worked so well in the case of the young girl's child, seems to me inappropriate. There is no one mandated attitude that Gauguin should feel.

Unhappiness with that option leads Wallace to canvas a third proposal: that we should accept that there can be an "all in" attitude of "deep ambivalence" (in my terminology a "verdictive" one). (p. 185) It seems to me, however, that while this is, on independent grounds, an overwhelmingly plausible diagnosis, it is the one thing a buck passer like Wallace cannot say. If ambivalence means the alternation of first one, and then another, practical verdict "all in", then it makes sense; what does not make sense is a final verdict that mandates two conflicting "all in" attitudes. The first would be a wholehearted affirmation that disables "all in" regret and the second a wholehearted sense of wrongness that enables it. This would be to embrace the practical paradox of mandated attitude. As I have noted, maybe the fact that these are practical commitments gives Wallace some latitude here. However, far more problematic is that embracing a verdictive attitude of ambivalence loses the distinctive nature of Wallace's treatment of the puzzle cases. In that treatment present affirmation makes regret unavailable while reflectively acknowledging past wrong. By contrast, a present attitude of "all in" ambivalence undercuts the whole structure.

It does so in two ways: by placing the agent in two inconsistent relations to "all in" regret (something we might be able to tolerate) and by severing the link between being verdictive and being wholehearted. (You cannot be wholeheartedly ambivalent except as a joke.) However, that link between the verdictive and the wholehearted formed a crucial part of the explanation of how "all in" affirmation disabled the operation of "all in" regret in the first place. It grounded Wallace's distinctive handling of his puzzle cases, so he cannot abandon it. I conclude that none of Wallace's three options in his treatment of rationally unjustified actions that lie in the past -- and their relation to overall verdicts -- can be made to work on his own terms.

I think Williams's particularist sympathies and hence his different understanding of the relation between the "pro tanto" and the "all in" is the real basis of the disagreement between him and Wallace over the Gauguin case. There are, of course, other differences: they have different attitudes to the relation between the moral life and the ethical life. Furthermore, it is not clear to me that what Williams means by "retrospective justification" is to be explained by Wallace's idea of an "affirmation dynamic". The idea that one's decisions may be subject to epistemic luck may be controversial, but it is not as controversial as the claim that I must necessarily affirm all the historically necessary conditions of that which I currently affirm.

In such a carefully wrought book it is a little surprising how little defence the affirmation dynamic receives. It plays a significant role in generating the extensive involvement with injustice that is a distinctive component of Wallace's overall view. Turning now to these political cases, Wallace's most general concern is that we are all the victims of bad circumstantial luck, quoting Adorno's remark that "wrong life cannot be lived rightly". We can imagine a counterfactual history where a considerably more globally just world was the product of a more benign history. That is not the world we live in; our worthwhile projects that we would happily affirm on reflection are bound up in a complex web of historically conditioned causes, many of which are grounded on past injustice. These include, notably, colonial exploitation and predatory capitalism.

At one stage Wallace's remarks take a very pointed form: "The elite institutions of higher education in the most developed economies are connected through extremely tight bonds to the plutocratic forces that control the levers of wealth and power in the world today". (p. 220) These home truths may be uncomfortable, but in a society with extensive inequality, such as the contemporary USA, they need to be said. I applaud a person in Wallace's position for saying them. My three concerns about this part of his argument are, first, that the generality of the discussion means that issues of different scope are brought together under a single description: the degree to which a higher education system is socially regressive, for example, seems to vary significantly between California and Massachusetts on the one hand and the relatively class-free society of Iceland on the other.

Second, and connectedly, the generality of the discussion makes the affirmation dynamic too blunt an instrument for developing a substantial theory of complicity with injustice of the kind developed, for example, in the work of Tamar Schapiro and others. But it is no objection to a position like Wallace's that it calls for further refinement and articulation by others.

The third point is the most troubling: Wallace seems to understand the bourgeois predicament as not only inescapable, but inescapable in a way that paralyses political action. Here the affirmation dynamic takes an odd turn; there is, for example, a moralistic cast to Wallace's admonition of those who build their life around a past history of bravery in war on the grounds that they should seek a more solid ethical foundation for their self-affirmation. Political action to reduce injustice, Wallace complains "has the perverse effect that one comes to define oneself primarily in terms of the lamentable conditions that one sets oneself against". (pp. 238-39) It is difficult to make this remark compatible with his later optimism that we can focus on our own personal projects in order to carve value out from the objectively lamentable conditions that made them possible. This is, it seems, self-undermining only in the case of projects whose content is political repair of the legacy of those objectionable circumstances.

This seems to me, once again, to reflect a specific blind spot in Wallace's buck passing commitments: the only action he thinks is relevant to past events is acting, in the present, trying to change them. However, no one engaged in challenging current injustices thinks they are in the business of changing past events. They are engaged, rather, in forward-looking actions of moral and political repair, a topic that is surprisingly neglected in Wallace's discussion.

All of the foregoing merely touches the surface of a range of rich and original discussions that are developed with a great deal of care. There is repetition in the book, perhaps inevitably, and some key assumptions of the argument remain under-developed, notably the workings of the "affirmation dynamic". This is, however, an intelligent and sophisticated treatment of a comparatively neglected topic within moral psychology that deserves to be widely read by anyone with an interest in ethics or political philosophy.