The Vindication of Nothingness

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Marco Simionato, The Vindication of Nothingness, Editiones Scholasticae, 2017, 210pp., $106.00, ISBN 9783868385878.

Reviewed by Frederick Kroon, University of Auckland


Analytic philosophers and classically trained logicians will probably remember chuckling at the passage in Alice Through the Looking Glass about Alice's failure to see the White King's Messenger (asked whether she could see the Messenger, Alice replied: "I see nobody on the road!" To which the King replied: "I only wish I had such eyes. To be able to see Nobody! And at that distance too!"). To many of us, this was the kind of nonsense produced by failing to attend to the logic of language, in this case the fact that words like 'nothing' and 'nobody' are quantifiers rather than noun phrases. The confusion seemed to have philosophical resonances as well. Heidegger was the philosopher who garnered special opprobrium on the part of analytic philosophers because his various speculations about Nothingness, including the seemingly nonsensical thought that "The Nothing itself nothings", seemed based on nothing more than a failure to grasp the quantificational nature of 'nothing'. (Carnap famously called Heidegger out for this egregious mistake in his "The Elimination of Metaphysics Through Logical Analysis of Language".)

Analytic philosophers aren't so sure anymore. A number of them have recently argued that a word like 'nothing' does function as a noun phrase, even if it also functions as a quantifier, and that it may even have a reference when so used (so that there is a sense in which nothing[ness] is something). In particular, according to Simionato's preferred Empty World account [EW], 'nothing' on its non-quantificational use refers to the absence of everything, while nothingness is the absolutely empty world, an entity that represents the absolute absence of everything. One piece of evidence, mentioned both in Graham Priest's useful Preface and by Simionato himself, is that to say that God created the world out of nothing is not the same as saying that there is nothing out of which God created the world, where the second use of 'nothing' is the quantificational use. After all, there being nothing out of which God created the world is consistent with God's doing no creating at all. Of course, we might take 'God created the world out of nothing' to mean 'God created the world and there is nothing out of which God created the world', but then we would have both a monadic and a dyadic creation predicate, and it would be nice to do with only one since there they are clearly linked in some way. After all, the claim that God created the world surely implies that either God created the world out of nothing or there are things out of which God created the world.

Simionato's book is an attempt to understand 'nothing' or nothingness as it features in philosophical claims of the above kind, and to relate this understanding to both historical discussions about nothingness (on the part of Hegel, for example) but also to the current debate about metaphysical nihilism: the view that there might have been nothing. The debate about metaphysical nihilism is an important one; it relates to the age-old question why there is something rather than nothing (anti-nihilists have a trivial answer to this question, it seems). But it is worth pointing out that metaphysical nihilism as such doesn't concern the nature of the nothing: the doctrine is standardly conceived in terms of a purely quantificational account of 'nothing', not 'nothing' as a noun phrase. So what Simionato proposes is not only to present a sympathetic study of a non-quantificational notion of nothingness, a notion that has until recently had a bad press among analytic philosophers, but to show that there is a deep connection between this topic and a well-known metaphysical debate about whether there might have been nothing (in the classic quantificational sense of 'nothing').

For reasons that will become clear, I think that in this enterprise he is only partly successful. But Simionato is certainly successful in showing that it is a journey worth undertaking. Here, briefly, is the way the book is organised. The suggestively entitled first chapter, 'An empty world is better than nothing', discusses a number of recent accounts of 'nothing' as a noun phrase, including that of Graham Priest and Alberto Voltolini, for both of whom 'nothing' as a noun phrase refers to a contradictory object: an absence that contains itself or a self-identical thing different from everything (Voltolini uses his account to interpret Heidegger's 'The nothing nothings', but thinks that we should only accept the nothing if we are ready to admit impossible objects, something about which Priest, of course, has no compunction). Simionato also discusses Oliver and Smiley's contrasting account of 'zilch' as an empty term -- empty because it would refer to a contradictory object if it did refer -- before proceeding to the intriguing topic of how all this relates to the idea of the empty set. Simionato is clear that these various accounts of 'nothing' all have their virtues, but thinks that what is needed to draw the various threads together is the idea of the empty world, the main concern of metaphysical nihilism. He introduces and motivates the idea in the final two sections of this first chapter.

Chapter 2 is on metaphysical nihilism (MN) and anti-nihilism. As I said earlier, the standard accounts of these positions don't take a stand on the notion of nothingness, just on the question of whether there could, quantificationally speaking, be nothing. MN has two readings, a weak reading on which it declares that there might not have been any concrete objects and a strong reading on which there might not have been any objects whatsoever, concrete or abstract. In possible world terms, then, weak MN says that there is a world with no concrete objects while strong MN says that there is a world with no objects whatsoever, concrete or abstract. This is a useful chapter, which runs through some of the most prominent arguments for and against MN, beginning with Tom Baldwin's subtraction argument for MN and some of its variations. The target here was mostly weak MN, although some of the anti-nihilist arguments, such as Heil's and McDaniel's, target strong NM (a global absence of objects would have to contain the fact that there are no objects, and so is impossible).

The fact that these arguments are seen as "controversial" in light of the various objections from other theorists is then seen as a reason to try something different, and in Chapter 3 we are presented with Simionato's own arguments for (strong) MN. The first he calls the "meontological" argument (from 'to mĂȘ eon' meaning 'what is not'), and it is based on the idea of absolutely unrestricted quantification: in quantifying in this manner one is "quantifying over a domain of discourse beyond which there are no objects at all", an absence (so Simionato thinks) that cannot be separated from the empty world in so far as the latter is something that represents this absence. The second argument is the "elenctic" argument, and I think is intended as a kind of reductio. It begins by assuming that there is no empty world, something that is supposedly explained by the contradictory nature of the empty world. But since there are no contradictory objects, that means that the term 'the empty world' refers to no object and hence to the absence of all objects: as Simionato puts it (I think rather awkwardly), the empty world is the absence of all objects. But since, as before, the empty world can't be separated from the absence of all objects, that means that the empty world must exist after all.

The chapter concludes with a discussion of the familiar problem of truthmakers for negative truths, in particular the proposition that there is nothing, which is presumably true in the empty world but can't have a truthmaker in that world. Simionato's solution is puzzling. He follows Armstrong's suggestion that, if X is a truthmaker for p and p entails q, then X is also a truthmaker for q. So, if we take the plurality of all objects to be a truthmaker for the proposition that there is an all-inclusive domain of discourse, which according to Simionato's "meontological" argument entails that there is an empty world, we can deduce that the plurality of all objects is a truthmaker for the proposition that there is an empty world. The latter entails that there are no objects whatsoever, leaving us with the plurality of all objects as truthmaker for the proposition that there are no objects whatsoever (p. 154). But this won't do as it stands. That there is an empty world entails only that there is a world in which there are no objects, one that, in Simionato's words, thereby represents the absence of all objects. So, all we can deduce is that the plurality of all objects is a truthmaker for the claim that there is something that represents that there are no objects whatsoever.

The final chapter discusses two cases where the notion of nothingness makes an appearance within continental philosophy, and where Simionato thinks his account can play a useful interpretative role. (In light of the discussion in Chapter 1, Simionato clearly thinks that the same is true of Heidegger's work on nothingness, but he wisely avoids entering the morass of Heidegger interpretation.) They are Hegel's metaphysics and the work of the Italian philosopher Emanuele Severino. What Simionato has to say here is complex but potentially important. I suspect, however, that its worth will depend on the cogency of the earlier chapters, and so that is where I want to spend the remainder of this review.

So, what are we to make of Simionato's new account of a non-quantificational notion of nothingness? I suggested earlier that the notion of an empty world is best understood quantificationally, in terms of its being a world in which there are no (concrete or abstract) objects; does Simionato succeed in interpreting this in terms of a substantive notion of nothing? Here I have my doubts. He thinks that the fact that the other arguments for a substantive notion of nothing are seen as contentious by their critics is a reason for trying out his own new arguments, but I suspect that the latter face criticisms that are at least as devastating.

Thus, consider the "meontological" argument. He uses the claim that it is possible to quantify over everything to deduce the further claim (E*) that, in quantifying over this all-inclusive domain, D, one is quantifying over a domain beyond which there are no objects at all. Fair enough. But Simionato takes this to imply that in quantifying over D, one is quantifying over a domain that makes reference to the maximal consistent situation according to which there are no objects at all, that is, the absence of all objects. But that seems simply false. To talk about there being no objects beyond the ones in the all-inclusive domain is to say nothing about a situation in which there are no objects at all. (If someone doesn't believe in the empty set but does believe in the universal one V, it is no use responding that talk of there being no objects beyond the ones in V commits one to accepting a situation in which there are no objects at all, a situation represented by the empty set.)

In some ways, the "elenctic" argument was harder to understand, partly because it initially wasn't altogether clear how to interpret some of the moves, e.g., the use of premise (EL1) that no object is contradictory, something that is affirmed even though the argument also suggests that the empty world is itself contradictory since it represents the absence of everything, including itself. As far as I can see, the elenctic nature of the argument is supposed to help us recognise that this is in the end not a genuine contradiction, but the argument could have been more clearly expressed. My main concern about the argument, however, is the way it relies on the inferential step from: 'The empty world doesn't exist (because it is a genuinely a contradictory object)' to 'The empty world is de facto the absence of everything'. It is hard to see the logic here. If the empty world doesn't exist, then the most we can say is that nothing at all is identical to the empty world. (I expect that we shouldn't even say this much; if the empty world doesn't exist, then the term 'the empty world' is empty; it doesn't really stand for an entity that is or is not identical to something.) But assuming we can make sense of the claim that the empty world is not identical to anything, note that what we have here is a purely negative, quantificational claim. Why think for a moment that it entails the identity between the empty world and the collective absence of everything, something that the remainder of the argument needs, given its reliance on the fundamental premise of [EW] that the empty world is an entity that represents the absence of all objects?

In brief, I was impressed with the questions Simionato raises, and impressed with his attempt to grapple with, and improve upon, the various answers these questions have received, but was left sceptical of central aspects of his answers. While, in Graham Priest's words, the book delivers a "welcome deepening of our understanding of nothing" (in the non-quantificational sense!), it also leaves me convinced that it is far too early to stop worrying about nothing.