The Virtue Ethics of Hume and Nietzsche

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Christine Swanton, The Virtue Ethics of Hume and Nietzsche, Wiley Blackwell, 2015, 277pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781118939390.

Reviewed by Craig Beam, Wilfrid Laurier University


This book, part of the New Directions in Ethics series, argues that Hume and Nietzsche should be interpreted as virtue ethicists, that they have much in common, and that they provide useful supplements to classical aretaic theories.

In the first two chapters, Christine Swanton argues that virtue ethics should be seen as a group of moral theories with different origins, rather than having a single progenitor in Aristotle (20). Hume and Nietzsche alike seek to rescue conceptions of the good life from an underpinning in religious morality and associated doctrines (6). Both are naturalists, and after discussing several senses of naturalism, Swanton defines them as "spare naturalists" (9). She argues that Hume should be read as a "response dependent" virtue ethicist in the tradition of Francis Hutcheson's moral sense theory. Likewise, Nietzsche is better viewed in such terms than as a moral skeptic.

I'm in agreement with this starting point, with one small quibble: I doubt that neo-Aristotelians are wedded to the idea that Aristotle is the sole father and source of virtue ethics. For example, Alasdair MacIntyre in After Virtue discussed the virtues as they appeared in Homer, the New Testament, Aquinas, Benjamin Franklin, and Jane Austin. However, MacIntyre contrasted the "Aristotelian Tradition" with the "Enlightenment Project" and "Genealogy" -- with Hume and Nietzsche respectively subsumed under the latter. MacIntyre and other early advocates of neo-Aristotelian ethics (such as G.E.M. Anscombe) were influenced by Catholicism and tended to regard "modern moral philosophy" as degenerate. Thus, they read Hume through the lens of mid-20th century trends in analytic ethics such as emotivism, and Nietzsche as either an immoralist or a postmodern skeptic. This stood in the way of seeing Hume and Nietzsche as virtue theorists.

Swanton devotes Chapters 3-5 to issues pertaining to Hume's virtue ethics, and does the same for Nietzsche in Chapters 6-8. In Chapter 3, Swanton shows how Hume can be both a moral sentimentalist and a virtue ethicist, arguing against Philippa Foot's view that Hume's theory commits him to a subjectivist view of ethics (58). In Chapter 4, Swanton considers the artificial virtue of justice and what natural motives support it. She claims that for Hume the motivation of the just person is deontological, in the sense of acting from duty, independent of consequences or self-interest (71). However, using the resources of Hume's theory, she thinks one could find motivation for justice in the natural motive of compassion (78). In Chapter 5, Swanton maintains that Hume has a pluralist account of the sources of moral sentiment and the taxonomy of the virtues, and that he is neither a utilitarian nor a consequentialist. She rejects Roger Crisp's "virtue utilitarian" reading of Hume whereby "what makes a trait a virtue is its tendency to promote good consequences overall" (90).

Swanton's account does not fully do justice to the contractarian and utilitarian sides of Hume's thought. What makes Hume's ethics complicated is that he is part of the moral sentiment tradition in regard to the natural virtues, but also an heir of Hobbes in regard to the artifice of justice and a precursor of Bentham and Mill in the emphasis he puts on utility. Yes, Hume is too pluralistic to make utility the sole criteria of virtue, or pleasure the sole basis of the good. Human happiness, he says, consists in activity and indolence as well as pleasure (60). The virtues are qualities "useful" and "immediately agreeable" to oneself or to others (59). Here the concept of the agreeable -- which could be linked to aretaic concepts such as the admirable or excellent or intrinsically valuable -- is a barrier to Crisp's reading whereby the virtues simply promote utility. However, you could turn it around and argue that the concept of the useful stands in the way of reading Hume in purely aretaic terms. Virtues may not be reducible to utility-promotion, but what makes at least some traits fitting of our approval remains linked to consequences. For example, I doubt one can give a persuasive analysis of why the ancient Spartans put a high value on military courage and why modern Canadians put a high value on tolerance without considering the conditions that make different virtues more or less utility-producing in different times and places.

As for justice, bringing in deontological notions of duty for its own sake seems foreign to Hume's neo-Hobbesian account of "artificial virtue." Hume asks rhetorically in the Enquiry: "what theory of morals can ever serve any useful purpose, unless it can show, by a particular detail, that all the duties, which it recommends, are also the true interest of each individual?" (80). It would appear that either Hume must follow Hobbes and argue that justice is in our true self-interest, or else must appeal to some natural passion or sentiment to explain our motivation to be just. This could be Hobbesian fear, or a more virtue ethical sense of honour, or compassion (as Swanton suggests), or perhaps an overlapping account in which each of these play a role for different types of people in different situations when dealing with different dimensions of justice. For example, considering the harsh justice that prevailed in 18th-century Britain -- hanging people for minor property offences -- it's quite understandable why Hume did not try to explain justice in terms of compassion. But maybe left-leaning citizens in a modern welfare state might pay their taxes out of benevolent fellow-feeling, thinking of the value of public spending in promoting equality and meeting basic needs.

Swanton turns to Nietzsche in Chapter 6, showing how his virtue ethics is compatible with his self-identification as an egoist and his attacks on pity and altruism. Nietzsche upholds a kind of "virtuous egoism" while rejecting non-virtuous forms of egoism and non-virtuous form of altruism (111). He glorifies the gift-giving virtue which overflows out of abundance. He criticizes the Mitleid which "suffers-with" and the altruism which escapes from self into otherness. In Chapter7, Swanton considers how Nietzsche can be both a virtue ethicist and an existentialist, and draws heavily on the psychology of Alfred Adler, Erich Fromm, and Karen Horney. In Chapter 8, Swanton argues that Nietzsche's perspectivism is compatible with objectivity, and that his ethics includes "universal virtues" as well as "differentiated" ones relative to different human types (157). It also discusses Nietzsche's view of justice as a virtue.

While the main contours of Swanton's reading are quite reasonable, I'd argue that the barrier to seeing Nietzsche as a virtue ethicist is not so much his egoism, but the way most of his treatment of morality focuses on negative critique and is presented in an unsystematic way. In places, Nietzsche identifies as an immoralist and claims to reject morality itself, although his target appears to be various Christian-Kantian moral concepts -- "morality the peculiar institution" as Bernard Williams would say. Nietzsche's criticism of pity or compassion is part of a debate with Schopenhauer and his world-denying philosophy

When it comes to the expressive individualist side of Nietzsche -- his concern with autonomy and self-realization -- it's better to read him as a 19th-century Romantic (broadly conceived) than through the lens of 20th-century existentialism. He has very different concerns from Heidegger and Sartre, and his ideal of autonomy is more of an organic "becoming who one is" than a radical assertion of existential freedom. Swanton does not really deny this -- she just seems more at home with 20th-century existentialism and psychology than with the 19th-century context of his thought.

Swanton also misses the parallels between Nietzsche and Hume in their views of justice as an artificial virtue. Several aphorisms in Human, All-Too-Human speak of justice in realist contractarian terms. In the First Essay of the Genealogy, Nietzsche's treats "good and bad" as first arising as a kind of "natural virtue" among the ancient nobles. But the Second Essay tells a different story about the beginning of justice and obedience to law, and how it was first burned into people through harsh punishments for breaking the social contract.

Finally, Swanton sums up the distinctive contributions of Hume and Nietzsche to the virtue ethical tradition. In Chapter 9, she considers Hume and focuses on the virtues of benevolence and love. She looks at how Michael Slote in Morals and Motives developed a morality of university benevolence based in part on 18th-century sentimentalism, and suggests doing something similar with the virtue of love. In Chapter 10, Swanton deals with Nietzsche and argues that he offers us a "virtue ethics of becoming" in which creativity plays a central role (195). Nietzsche, like Aristotle, is concerned with self-realization, but for him it's not a fixed telos related to the good for humans in general, but something unique, open-ended, and creative.

If asked to explain Hume's distinctive contribution to ethics, I'd focus more on how he represents the pre-eminent expression of an Enlightenment virtue ethics, and how his pluralism can open up dialogue between virtue ethics and utilitarian or contractarian views. Yes, he puts more emphasis on love and benevolence than do Aristotle and the ancient Greeks, or Kant and the moral rationalists, but one could point to many lesser-known modern theorists who have placed love or compassion at the centre of ethics -- from Christians who emphasize love over law, to Schopenhauer's morality of pity, to the eloquent treatment of Caring by Nel Noddings. Often these theorists have departed from the pluralism of the virtue tradition and tried to make one other-regarding sentiment the sole basis of ethics.

As for Nietzsche, his expressive individualist emphasis on creativity, pride, and self-development is more novel as a contribution to virtue ethics, although something he shared with many 19th-century thinkers influenced by Romanticism. For example, Nietzsche was a reader and admirer of Emerson, and Mill cites Wilhelm von Humboldt in On Liberty when upholding individuality and self-development as elements of human well-being.

There are two other original and important aspects of Nietzsche's account of the virtues that Swanton does not really analyze. First, his emphasis on intellectual honesty as a virtue, in the sense of being honest with oneself, facing hard truths, and refusing to distort one's thinking in the name of any religious faith or political ideology. Second, what we might call the virtue of amor fati which involves the ability to affirm one's life, love one's fate, avoid resentment, and accept the basic conditions of human existence (such as our bodies and our mortality). There is definitely a striving and overcoming part of Nietzsche's ideal, but also another part which wants to affirm life and nature as it is. Thus Spoke Zarathustra begins with Zarathustra preaching self-overcoming to the crowd in the marketplace, but culminates with him saying "Yes" to life and eternal recurrence.


Beam, Craig (1996). "Hume and Nietzsche: Naturalists, Ethicists, Anti-Christians," in Hume Studies 22:2, 299-324.

Beam, Craig (2001). "Ethical Affinities: Nietzsche in the Tradition of Hume," in International Studies in Philosophy 33:3, 87:98.

Hume, David (1983). An Enquiry Concerning the Principles of Morals, ed. J.B. Schneewind. Hackett.

MacIntyre, Alasdair (1981). After Virtue. University of Notre Dame Press.

Noddings, Nel (1984). Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education. University of California Press.

Williams, Bernard (1985). Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy. Harvard University Press.