The Virtues of Happiness: A Theory of the Good Life

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Paul Bloomfield, The Virtues of Happiness: A Theory of the Good Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 253pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199827367.

Reviewed by Neera K. Badhwar, University of Oklahoma/George Mason University


Paul Bloomfield's book is a welcome addition to the recent literature on virtue and happiness, understood as eudaimonia or a Good Life (10). Happiness in this sense refers to a life that is good for the person living it, as distinct from merely a life filled with happy feelings, or a life that feels fulfilling. Bloomfield's aim is to give a new argument for the ancient claim that virtue is partly constitutive of happiness. His central insight is that happiness requires valuing everything, including oneself and others, at their true worth, and that we are virtuous to the extent that we do. In particular, happiness requires self-respect, and self-respect requires respect for others as ends in themselves. Bloomfield's detailed treatment of these claims, and especially of the second, which links the modern notion of respect and self-respect to the ancient notion of happiness, is both genuinely original and interesting.

Bloomfield argues that "living morally or virtuously is necessary and sufficient for people to live as happily as possible, given who they are and their circumstances" (6). This should not be confused with the Stoic view that virtue is both necessary and sufficient for happiness, for it does not claim that virtue overcomes all misfortune or that our circumstances make no difference to our happiness (6-7). What it claims is simply that, regardless of our circumstances, without virtue we cannot be happy, and with virtue our lives are happier than they could be otherwise. This thesis is defended in three long chapters.

Bloomfield's main foils are ethical egoists such as Hume's Sensible Knave and others who are improperly partial to themselves and those they care about, on the one hand, and "moralists," on the other (Ch. 1). The former believe that their own happiness (or their own and the happiness of those they care about) is the most valuable thing in the world and that morality is generally opposed to their happiness, whereas the latter believe that happiness is one thing and morality another, and when they conflict, morality ought to win (6-7). Both egoists and moralists conceive of morality as something inherently selfless, and happiness as inherently selfish, and this is a big part of the problem. Even when a moralist like Kant acknowledges the moral importance of self-regarding attitudes like, say, self-respect, and condemns servility, he locates the importance of self-respect in a demand of rationality, instead of a demand of our happiness (16 ff.). Morality shows us how to live a good life by coordinating our interests and actions with those of others (22 ff.), by reconciling other-regard with self-regard, and this is the source of morality's authority (40-42).

Bloomfield agrees that immorality is (often) irrational, but points out that this is not enough to justify morality to the egoist -- for if he is persuaded that he is irrational, he may no more care about rationality than about morality. An argument with bite must start from shared premises, that is, premises that both immoralists and those who care about morality share. These premises are that (i) their own happiness is important to them, and (ii) happiness requires self-respect. If the egoists are persuaded that they lack self-respect, they are unlikely to say that they don't care about self-respect.

Bloomfield's main argument against the egoists, whom he calls the Foscos after the arch-villain in The Woman in White, and whom he opposes to the Hartrights, named after the hero of the novel, appears in Ch. 1. The Foscos believe that they are inherently superior to the Hartrights for they, the Foscos, see life as it is, whereas the Hartrights are dupes of morality. The Foscos see themselves as strong and self-respecting, and the Hartrights as weak, self-deceived, and lacking in self-respect (45ff.). Hence the Foscos feel justified in taking advantage of the Hartrights whenever necessary for advancing their own interests. The Foscos and Hartrights agree that being seriously self-deceived is incompatible with self-respect and thus with the Good Life, but each thinks that it's the other who is self-deceived. Bloomfield's task is to show that it's the Foscos who are mistaken.

Bloomfield's first argument is ontological. He argues that paradigm forms of immorality, such as coercion, treachery, and manipulation are harmful to their perpetrators because they are incompatible with self-respect and thus with happiness. Here Bloomfield draws on a distinction made by Stephen Darwall, and before him by Elizabeth Telfer, between "appraisal respect" and "recognition respect" (61). Appraisal respect is based on an individual's achievements or character, whereas recognition respect is based on the fact that, because she is a human being, she is intrinsically valuable, an end in herself and not a thing. Here Bloomfield departs from the usual view that what makes us ends in ourselves is our rationality or agency or capacity for morality, arguing that it is simply our human-ness that bestows this status on us. The Foscos, however, treat others -- or those they don't care about -- as mere things. Either they deny that people are ends in themselves and, thus, deny the existence of recognition respect, or they acknowledge that there is such a thing as recognition respect, but claim that only they have the properties that grounds such respect. In the first case they fail to respect themselves and thus harm themselves. In the second case, they are inconsistent in failing to treat like cases alike, and this makes their self-respect fraudulent (62-63). In either case, they fail to be happy.

But why does failing to treat like cases alike make the Foscos' self-respect fraudulent? Because in denying that the properties that make people ends in themselves are sufficient reason for treating others with recognition respect, the Foscos also in effect deny that the properties that make them ends are sufficient reason for treating themselves with recognition respect. This argument succeeds, however, only if it's true that (i) what makes us ends in ourselves is simply our biological status as human beings, and (ii) no one who thinks that it's our rationality, agency, or capacity for morality that makes us ends can have recognition respect for anyone. Yet both assumptions carry a heavy argumentative burden. Bloomfield does say that his argument succeeds even if (i) is false (65, n. 62). But if it is false, the Foscos could easily say (as people have often said about those outside their own community) that they have recognition respect for members of their own community because only they have the requisite properties. They would still be badly mistaken in thinking that only members of their own community have these properties, but because they have recognition respect for some people, they have some genuine self-respect.

Bloomfield's epistemological argument, however, succeeds without the assumption that it is our human-ness that makes us ends (72-79). Self-respect requires self-knowledge, and a "human being's self-knowledge requires knowledge of other human beings" (75). As he argues earlier, "we could not be who we are as individuals were we not human beings" (68). So if the Foscos are blind to others' status as ends, they must be blind to their own as well. Hence they lack recognition self-respect.

Here again, however, it is important to distinguish between those who don't recognize anyone's, or hardly anyone's, status as ends, and those who don't recognize this status of some classes of people: foreigners, or those who pray to foreign gods, or women, and so on. Sometimes Bloomfield writes as though his argument from lack of self-knowledge applies equally to all such people. But provided that their own community is fairly large, those who downgrade only outsiders do have some understanding of other human beings. Hence, too, they have some self-knowledge and, thus, some self-respect and happiness.

Bloomfield recognizes that the Foscos might say that they don't care about recognition self-respect, only appraisal self-respect. But he argues persuasively that appraisal respect "only makes sense against a background of recognition respect" (88). If we were "mere instruments that can only do what they do and cannot be or do otherwise," there would be no ground for respecting their achievements (88). I agree with Bloomfield here, but note that he is now basing recognition respect on the capacity for choice that most adult human beings have, and not merely on membership in the species, homo sapiens.

As a last-ditch effort, the Foscoes might respond that they don't need self-respect to be happy, but in so responding, they contradict their claim that it's the Hartrights, those dupes of morality, who lack self-respect, thus losing whatever advantage they had over them (89). Bloomfield has turned the tables on the Foscoes.

In Ch. 2 Bloomfield addresses the paradox of happiness, the idea that doing everything for the sake of one's happiness is self-defeating. He rejects Henry Sidgwick's argument that it's self-defeating because such a focus distracts us from investing ourselves in the projects and relationships that make us happy, an investment that is necessary for happiness (96-97). For if that were the only problem, we could decide to put thoughts of our own happiness on the back burner, but still invest ourselves in our projects and relationships as mere means to our happiness, believing that our happiness was the most valuable thing in the world. It's this very notion -- that our happiness is the most valuable thing in the world, and that nothing else has any value independently of our happiness -- that is the problem. Happiness requires a life lived in recognition of the fact that other people have value in their own right, as do many projects, value that is independent of our happiness. It is the proper or virtuous pursuit of such inherently valuable things (or, at any rate, some of them), and virtuous relationships with good people, that make us truly happy. Such pursuits and relationships become partly constitutive of our happiness. The Foscos fail to be happy because they are "improperly and immorally partial" to themselves, their families, or their communities, and have "false beliefs and expectations about how to live well and be happy" (111).

I agree with Bloomfield's general point that happiness requires appreciating the inherent value of people and things, and not merely their instrumental value for our happiness. But his argument raises some important questions. Granted that it's wrong to think that our happiness is the only or even the most important thing in the world, is it also wrong to think that our happiness is the most important thing in the world to us? The latter is compatible with recognizing that others' happiness may be the most important thing in the world to them, that there are inherently valuable things in the world. Further, if it's the virtuous incorporation of (certain) independently valuable things in our lives that makes our lives happy, then what's wrong with holding that our happiness -- our good life -- is the most important thing in the world to us? Isn't this the same thing as saying that acting virtuously in pursuit of independently valuable things in our lives is the most important thing in the world to us?

A partial answer to these questions is given in Bloomfield's use of Joseph Butler's distinction between our happiness and the things that make us happy (97-98). Bloomfield argues that "If we invest ourselves fully in what makes us happy, and if we have chosen well in this regard, then there is no further reason for us to be motivated by our own happiness per se on top of being already motivated by what we already take to be valuable" (132). We need take account of our happiness again only if we find that our choice is not making us happy.

Now if being "motivated by our own happiness per se" means constantly dwelling on whether or not our choices are producing positive emotions or bringing external rewards, Bloomfield's advice is sound. But Bloomfield goes beyond such advice when he states that "we must not be motivated to tend to [what makes us happy] because of its instrumental value for our own happiness . . . rather, we must genuinely be motivated to tend to it because it is itself of value, as an end in itself, and for no other reason" (133, cf. 207). In short, we must not be motivated by happiness because this is incompatible with being motivated by the inherent value of the things that make us happy. This raises two questions. First, why can't we be motivated by the things that make us happy both as ends in themselves and instrumentally? If I love both math and philosophy, but choose to become a math teacher because it pays better, and the better pay is a means to my happiness, I choose being a math teacher partly for instrumental reasons, and continue to teach it partly for instrumental reasons. Second, why can't we be motivated by something both as an end in itself and as part of our happiness? There are many inherently valuable activities or projects to choose from, but phronesis -- practical wisdom -- dictates that I choose the one that is partly constitutive of my happiness, and continue to engage in it so long as it is part of my happiness. Bloomfield's arguments give no reason to think that I cannot or ought not to do so.

He does say that "when we have to choose between the two," i.e., happiness and what makes us happy, such as our own children, "we ought to regard the latter as more important than our happiness," because if we continue to think that both are equally important, "our motivational structure will be divided and we'll end up undermining our happiness" (130ff.). But this claim is restricted to conflict situations, unlike the claim discussed above. Even this restricted claim, however, can't be true of every valuable thing that makes us happy, for example, math instruction. If I lose interest in teaching math, and become interested in, say, writing novels, I have no good reason to continue teaching math. We ought to choose our children over our happiness because we have an obligation to them, but there is no such obligation to everything valuable.

Bloomfield's reason for not choosing our happiness over our children, viz., that if we do so "we'll end up undermining our happiness," also needs qualification. For if we choose our children over our happiness, we are, by hypothesis, also undermining our happiness. The most Bloomfield can claim here is that doing so is less undermining than not doing so. Sometimes, as Philippa Foot has argued, no matter what we do, we undermine our happiness (2001).

In Ch. 3, Bloomfield makes even stronger claims against regarding happiness as a goal. He argues that happiness is only a side-effect or by-product of living virtuously (207-208). "What ought to take pride of place in practical decision making is not being happy, but being virtuous" (208). But by-products are unimportant, and often undesirable, products, like the smoke from a coal engine. So if happiness is only a by-product, it's hard to see it as valuable, and if it's valuable, it's hard to see why it should altogether drop out of our deliberation and motivation. For reasons given above, instrumental and non-instrumental motivations can exist simultaneously. Further, if happiness consists largely of virtuous activity, then in deliberating about the virtuous thing to do we can't help but be aware that doing it is part of leading a happy life. Bloomfield's sidelining of happiness in deliberation and motivation is in tension with his central argument that we ought to be virtuous because virtue is constitutively necessary for happiness.

There is, of course, a conception of happiness on which Bloomfield's view that happiness ought not to be central in practical decision making is (usually) true: the purely psychological sense of feeling good about one's life, having positive moods, or having a long-term sense of self-fulfillment. But this is not Bloomfield's conception of happiness.

Bloomfield's recommendations in his discussion of love of people are equally austere. He argues that although love of good people is rewarding, we ought not to love them for the sake of the reward -- including the reward of having our love reciprocated (221). Having our love returned is also, he states, a by-product of love (although see 219, n. 74). But at least in romantic love and friendship, being loved or liked back is of the very essence of a relationship worth having, and the desire for being loved or liked, and the belief that we are or will be loved or liked, is necessary for letting our feelings grow and sticking with the relationship.

Bloomfield concludes the book in Ch. 3 by providing a lively and original discussion of the virtues of justice, courage, temperance, and phronesis (practical wisdom), and their role in the good life. He recognizes that the virtues are related to each other, but rejects the unity of virtue doctrine that says that there is only one virtue: phronesis. He also offers an excellent argument against the Stoics, pointing out that if happiness is identical with virtue, then, if a disaster killed everyone except for one virtuous person, on the Stoic view he would, implausibly, continue to be happy (203).

There is much else worth discussing in this book, but space restrictions prevent me from doing so. Bloomfield is more optimistic than I that acting virtuously is always more happiness-making than acting non-virtuously, regardless of the situation, but I agree with his basic point about the centrality of virtue in a happy life. All in all, Bloomfield's book makes an important contribution to the eudaimonistic literature and is also a pleasure to read.