The Virtues of Limits

The Virtues Of Limits

David McPherson, The Virtues of Limits, Oxford University Press, 2022, 187pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192848536.

Reviewed by Todd May, Warren Wilson College


At the outset of his seminal work The Feast of Fools, the theologian Harvey Cox distinguishes between “world-changers” and “life-celebrators.” World-changers see what is wrong with the world and hope to ameliorate it. The danger is that, having lost a sense of what is beautiful in the world, they can also lose a sense of the joy of being in the world and even a vision of what they would like the world to be. On the other hand, life-celebrators are in touch with the world’s joy and beauty, but risk forgetting that there is much suffering and oppression that needs to be addressed.

In his book, David McPherson comes down clearly on the side of the life-celebrators. Not uncritically so, but assuredly. However, in contrast to Cox, McPherson’s form of celebration involves limits rather than the joyous abandon of The Feast of Fools. For McPherson, celebrating life and developing the limiting virtues of humility, reverence, loyalty, contentment, and so on, need to be woven together in order to live a worthwhile human life.

The distinction McPherson draws in the first chapter, “Existential Limits,” and the founding distinction of the book, is between the “choosing-controlling stance” and the “accepting-appreciating stance.” It is the latter, he argues, that should be the ground of our relation to the world. In a move reminiscent of thinkers like Iris Murdoch, Susan Wolf, and Elizabeth Anderson, McPherson claims that unless we find something objectively worthy of our reverence, our choosing becomes ungrounded, even arbitrary. After all, if all value comes from my choosing, what reason can I give for my choice other than, “I chose it”? I could just as easily have chosen otherwise.

The “choosing-controlling” stance, which McPherson calls “Promethean” and associates with thinkers as diverse as Nietzsche and Ronald Dworkin in his defense of genetic engineering, sees us as masters of the world. It is our choices that confer value and, as such, diminish the reverence or respect we should properly have for what already exists. This does not mean that we should revere everything uncritically, but rather that we must revere some things in order to ask properly what ought to be chosen, controlled, modified, or changed. “if we come to see everything as up for grabs, where there are no ends or objects of choice of great importance such that they can place constraints on our choices, then this will deflate our sense of the importance of choice; we are left with a disenchanted view of the world” (24).

To embrace the “accepting-appreciating stance,” McPherson recommends the development of four virtues: humility, reverence, contentment, and loyalty. Humility is self-referential; it concerns how one should position oneself in the world. By contrast, reverence is directed outward toward the objects worth revering. Contentment contrasts with maximizing; it is a matter of being satisfied with what is necessary for a good life. Loyalty, he argues, is “to the given,” to the existent world rather than to an ideal that requires the rejection of that world.

In the succeeding three chapters of the book, McPherson considers three other kinds of limits: moral, political and economic. His discussion of moral limits is founded on both the Aristotelean and Confucian traditions. The relevance of Aristotle should be clear here, but one might be surprised at the reference to Confucius. For McPherson, though, forms of politeness and ritual are central to valuing other people. He emphasizes the role of good manners and filial piety toward parents and elders. “The person who discards all social conventions or rituals does not, in fact, see most clearly but instead becomes blind to the reality of that which is respect-worthy and reverence-worthy and so invites moral nihilism” (57). This leads to a discussion of the absolute prohibition on murder and the importance of neighborliness as an additional limiting virtue.

The argument for neighborliness is founded on the respect for what is around one. It leads, as McPherson recognizes, to a valuing of the proximate over the distant. This is in contrast to Peter Singer’s argument of the irrelevance of distance in moral concerns. The position here strikes me as weak. Relying on an argument from Andrew Cohen, McPherson argues that the distinction between saving a drowning child and addressing extreme poverty is one between a current emergency and a structural problem. However, it seems to me that a starving child is in a situation that is emergent in much the same way as a drowning child; for that child, the immediate problem is not the structure of impoverishment but a lack of food.

The third chapter concerns political limits. McPherson continues here with the theme of neighborliness, insisting on the importance of what he calls “patriotism.” He defines patriotism in terms of “the capacity to love where they are from, to find beauty in the place in which they live, and thereby to belong to and be at home in their place” (88). This does not require, he argues, a blind allegiance to one’s country or nationality, but instead allows criticism in order to improve the place to which one is attached. He contrasts this view of political limits with both ideal theory and, relatedly, a utopian vision. Neither of these approaches sufficiently accounts for the specificity of the place which is the object of patriotism. Again, here, we see the priority of the “accepting-appreciating stance” over the “choosing-controlling stance.”

In line with this approach, McPherson argues for a sufficientarian approach to distributive justice against an egalitarian approach. The object of distributive justice is to support a community where everyone has enough rather than a utopian vision in which everyone is equal. After all, he says, “We need to acknowledge that human beings are a mixed bag” (114), and, moreover, utopian schemes deny our rootedness in the particular places to which we are attached. Any utopian or egalitarian scheme is likely to be Promethean in character, endorsing choosing and controlling over accepting and appreciating. And, near the end of the chapter, he argues for moderation as a political virtue, a virtue that at once recognizes the limits of political intervention and allows for the humility and reverence discussed earlier.

Among the political limits he discusses is a limit on immigration. Patriotism allows for the privileging of one’s fellow citizens over the needs over those who are outside one’s political community. This, he believes, is in keeping with political moderation and anti-utopianism. I found this argument unconvincing, mostly because it seems to me still too ideal, that is, still too divorced from our political reality. Much of the immigration that comes to the U.S. from its southern border is a result, not of Others who would like to enjoy Our benefits, but instead as a product of U.S. policy toward Central and South America for the past century and a half. To argue for patriotism on the grounds of the integrity of one’s community is to posit an insularity that does not reflect the history of political relations, and thus steps in an unfortunate way into ideal theory.

The final chapter concerns economic limits. The master limiting virtue here is contentment, which does not mean being content with any lot that has been distributed to one, but instead being content with enough rather than expressing an unlimited acquisitiveness. McPherson finds a connection between this acquisitiveness and the Promethean view of the “choosing-controlling stance.” It denies the attachment to one’s place and one’s world which would characterize contentment in favor of an “always more” attitude that neglects that attachment. In this vein, he criticizes what he takes to be Marx’s view on private property, arguing that “we should affirm the importance of private property for settlement or being at home in the world, that is, it is important to have property of our own (a house, land, etc.), marked off from public spaces and public demand” (146). This, unfortunately, is a misreading of Marx, who did not demand the expropriation of all private property, for instance everyone’s house, but instead the expropriation of the means of production.

In any event, the idea is to be at home in one’s world, attached to it in a way that allows for contentment rather than continual pursuit of gain. To reinforce this, the chapter concludes with the importance of some kind of Sabbath, secular or not. “Here one ceases for a time from the choosing-controlling stance and instead adopts an accepting-appreciating stance toward what is of value in the given world, and also, if one is a theist, toward its ultimate creative source (God)” (158).

As suggested with this last quote quotation, throughout the book there is a religious undertone. McPherson claims—rightly in my view—that one need not have religious commitments to recognize the important of the limiting virtues he discusses. (Although he sometimes gives the edge to a religious orientation, for instance when he writes that, “it does seem that there is some loss of meaning if one cannot fully inhabit a non-metaphorical theistic way of speaking about life as a gift” (40).) However, his discussion is peppered with quotations from the Bible as well as other religious thinkers. This, to my atheist mind, is actually a good thing, even though at times I found his specific arguments to be weak. There is often a tendency in philosophical discussion to shy away from appealing to religious sources, a tendency that (and I admit sharing it) can isolate philosophical discussion from the wider intellectual culture.

At its best, McPherson’s book calls us to recognize the importance of an objective view of the good, one that deserves our recognition and respect and that imposes limits on the ways in which we navigate the world. As such, it is a contribution to an important strand of ethical thought.


Cox, Harvey, The Feast of Fools, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1969.