The Weight of All Flesh: On the Subject-Matter of Political Economy

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Eric L. Santner, The Weight of All Flesh: On the Subject-Matter of Political Economy, Oxford University Press, 2016, 291pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190254087.

Reviewed by Bastian Ronge, Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin


The Tanner Lectures on Human Values are a well-known academic event with a great reputation, regularly presented at certain universities across the United States. In April 2014 Eric L. Santner presented his Tanner Lectures at the University of California, Berkeley. According to custom, the lectures were afterwards revised for publication and supplemented by an introduction (by the editor, Kevin Goodman) and by the official comments of Bonnie Honig, Peter E. Gordon and Hent de Vries and Santner's responses. The book is neither a monograph nor an anthology. It is a distinct genre, which gives the reader a fascinating insight into the vibrancy of thinking and arguing within the humanities.

The following review cannot fully display the theoretical richness of the book. It offers philosophical reflections as well as literary interpretations and psychoanalytical considerations, and the reader encounters some of the most important thinkers of the last two centuries (for example Karl Marx, Michel Foucault, Jacques Lacan, Giorgio Agamben, Jacques Derrida). Rather, the review will focus on Santner's main line of argument and reconstruct the three comments, including Santner's responses. As the title indicates, Santner dedicates his lectures to the question of the subject matter of political economy. This is a question which accompanied economic sciences from their beginning and sparked off several heated debates (for example the famous controversy between Carl Menger and Gustav Schmoller in the 19th century and that between Lionel Robbins and Terence Hutchison in the 20th century). With the rise of methodological instrumentalism in the 20th century, famously presented by Milton Friedman in his 1953 essay on "The Methodology of Positive Economics", modern economic sciences banished the question of its distinct subject matter, without resolving it. With his lectures Santner raises this haunting question again and comes up with an intriguing, based mainly upon his previous studies On Creaturely Life (2006) and The Royal Remains (2011).

As Santner has shown in his previous works, human life is always "Life lived under normative pressure" (82). Human beings are confronted with normative expectations and obligations, knowing at the same time that there is no "ultimate grounding or authorization of those normative statuses" (84). This situation leads to "an excess, a 'too much' of pressure that indexes the contingency of the norms in question", which "give[s] flesh to a form of life" and "infuse[s] the bindingness of its norms with a dimension of psychosomatic passion" (84). Evidently, the two concepts -- flesh and forms of life -- play a central role in Santner's account of the subject matter of political economy. The word flesh denotes, according to Santner, the stuff, which "emerges out of the entanglement of the somatic and normative pressures that constitute creaturely life" (83). Every form of life has to deal with this "spectral carnality that forms at and as the unstable jointure of the somatic and the normative dimension of human life" (238). In previous times this spectral carnality was represented in the second body of the King and theoretically reflected in Political Theology, or so Santner argues with reference to Ernst Kantorowicz's study on The King's Two Bodies (1957). According to Santner, however, "the subject matter that Ernst Kantorowicz elaborated in his famous study of medieval and early-modern political theology . . . never disappeared from the life of the citizen-subjects of modern, constitutional states" (23). It has entered, moreover, into the realm of political economy. The economy is the field, in which now the "displacement and redistribution" (30) of the released "surplus of immanence" (23) is organized and performed in theory and practice. Therefore, Santner intends his lectures to shift the focus to the "heretofore neglected" (24) realm of political economy and to track the different ways in which the flesh is located "in the domain of political economy" after the "ostensible 'excarnation' of sovereignty" (30).

Following the implications of Santner's general thesis would open up a whole new perspective on the theoretical corpus of political economy. Every single book of early Political Economy (from the Physiocrats to James Steuart, from Adam Smith to David Ricardo) could now be reread as an attempt to give a new symbolic home to the released energy of the flesh. Santner himself, however, restricts his analysis exclusively to Karl Marx and his theory of the "dual character of . . .  labor" (46). Santner's general argument reads like this: "What Marx characterizes as the dual character of the labour embodied in commodities is. . .  a two-body doctrine transferred from the political theology of sovereignty to the realm of political economy" (46). Hence, the "famous 'metaphysical subtleties and theological niceties' . . . that Marx discovered in the realm of commodities" (46) are nothing but the transformed "'stuff' of the king's glorious body" (23). Based on this argument, Santner induces that the capitalist economy "as a whole functions as (liturgical) service" (113). The "fantasmatic substance once borne by the bearer of the royal office becomes a . . . dimension of social life elaborated, above all, in economic activities and relations" (31). Or to put it bluntly: "The King's Two Bodies becomes, as it were, every body's busy-ness" (31). In this new form of life, the economic practices of "production, exchange, and consumption" are "the site in which . . .  new 'mystical and ecstatic' unions are sealed" (72). This is, in a nutshell, Santner's main thesis, which he advances throughout s by carrying out literary analyses and elaborating on philosophical and psychoanalytical themes. Due to space constraints, I will not go further into detail here, but rather shift the focus to the three comments on Santner's lectures and his response to them.

Honig takes up "Santner's turn to 'flesh'" (134). Santner's investigation into the "theo-political economy" (132), she maintains, falls short of accounting for the dimension of the democratic, which "is neither political theological nor political economic, . . .  though in practice always imbricated with the other two" (143). In Herman Melville's Moby-Dick, Honig identifies "distinct democratic moments" (142), which allows her to carve out the particular "politics of the flesh" (137), which is opened up by the phenomenon of "animal flesh" (142). Animal flesh "electrifies but also de-exceptionalizes the human" and "becomes -- or might become -- the occasion of a new social relation" (152) namely democratic ones. Honig's turn to the political is informed by Hannah Arendt and provides an alternative to the "left theory's love for Melville's 'Bartleby, the Scrivener.'" (142). "If the problem to which Santner wants to alert us is that of the always busy body", Honig argues, "Bartleby's unbusied body might well seem to provide a perfect counter. But there may be a reason to take the risk of busy-ness rather than try to avoid it, or try to rework rather than abandon it" (143). In his response, Santner emphasizes the fact that Honig is the only one of the three commentator, who "ventured to elaborate an original contribution to what I refer to as a 'new thinking of the flesh'" (260). Although there are theoretical differences between them, primarily with regard to the question whether animal flesh allows us to make democratic experiences or not, Santner considers these disagreements as "the stuff of (university) office comedy, the sorts of things that . . .  make academics into the sorts of busy-bodies they are but that do not . . .  change the fundamental subject-matter that remains at issue" (259f.).

Gordon, focuses in his comment on the "underlying premises" of Santner's lectures in order to "mark the point at which our paths diverge" (183). According to him, Santner's argument merges "two modes of critique" (185), which are incompatible with each another: on the one hand, the "new post-Schmittian" critique of liberal democracy, which assumes the "spectral persistence of political-theological powers" (184) in it and, on the other hand, Marx' critique of capitalism, which is based on his "well-known analysis of commodity fetishism" (185). The synthesis of these two modes of critique cannot work out, Gordon argues, since the "historical genealogy in the mode of political theology works to solidify the very continuity between past and present that materialist criticism aims to disrupt" (186). Or to be more precise: The attempt of bringing together political theology and Marx's critique of political economy, inherits "from political theology a strain of anti-modernism that denies the moment of enlightenment that belonged to historical materialism as its rightful inheritance" (200). Hence, Santner's argument ignores the fact that Marx wants his reader to gain "a better understanding of the 'mystery' of the commodity-form" (199) and that his "critical analysis" is, therefore, "an exercise in demystification" (199). Santner's one-sided adoption of Marx associates him with some sort of "left-Hegelian critique of religion that Marx had tried to overcome" (201). Instead of dealing with real economic problems like exploitation, Gordon argues, Santner's critique results in the call for "a radical break" with current forms of life in the mode of "theological revelation", only in "the inverted form as a sudden awakening from religion" (201).

Santner's response to Gordon's critique is "much shorter and less systematic" (260) than the one to Honig, since Gordon made only a "vegan response" (260) to the outlined proposal for a "'new thinking of the flesh'" (260). Santner's remark addresses, therefore, primarily the main idea of flesh as a "dimension of human embodiment" (262) and Gordon's critique of his reading of Marx. Santner rejects this criticism, arguing that Gordon had not understood the mode of critique, which the science of flesh demands.

the critique of political economy (or of political theology, for that matter) must find ways to engage the 'lower layer' . . .  of libidinal economy. It is this lower layer of the work of critique that has gone missing in Gordon's understanding of things; there is, for him no subject-matter in the subject matter (264).

In other words: Since Gordon did not take into account the dimension of flesh his hint at the "rational-universalist structure of historical materialist criticism" (188) misses the whole point of Santner's approach to political economy.

De Vries' comment also targets the "premises underlying Santner's argument" (204). His critique seems to complement or rather reverse the perspective Gordon developed. While Gordon criticizes Santner for ignoring the "rational-universalist structure of historical materialist criticism" (188), de Vries criticizes him for falling short of Jacques Derrida's hauntological interpretation of Marx. In maintaining "that 'the metaphysical subtleties and theological niceties' of the commodity form are nothing else then another manifestation of the hauntonlogical stuff, which beforehand 'belonged to the realm of the king'", Santner assumes a "solidity and divisibility where there may well be none" (216). With this, de Vries argues, Santner makes a "move beyond 'hauntology'" and triggers a "relapse into yet another 'dogmatic image of thought' (as Gilles Deleuze would have called it) that one had hoped to avoid" (209). De Vries also expresses the concern that Santner's exclusive adoption of Marxian concepts like "commodification, reification, fetishization, and the like" are less "pertinent to the analysis of the theologico-political legacy", which Santner aims at, than other theological-economic concepts like "reserve, debt, and gift" (208). Similar to the response to Gordon, Santner's comments on de Vries' critique are rather short and unsystematic -- maybe because Santner does "not really understand" a "great deal" (266) of it, as he frankly admits. In particular, he does not seem to understand de Vries's concern about the re-solidification of the hauntological. For Santner, genealogical investigations into "the historicity" (267) of the flesh are simply useful to get a "better grasp of the powers by which we are really governed" and to show the "historically mutable ways in which that which does not work is, precisely, put to work at the 'lower level' of our social mediation, the affective binding of subjects to their form of life and to one another" (271).

This is an extremely rich and valuable book. It is focused on the most challenging and controversial question which economic thinking can be confronted with, namely, the question of the subject matter of economic science. What is the object of our thoughts, when we think about the economy or the economical? Santner proposes an intriguing and provocative answer to it, which marks -- as he emphasises in his response to Honig -- not the end, but the very start of research on the subject matter of political economy. With this in mind, the shortcomings of the book -- the rather unsystematic character of Santner's argument, the unwillingness to prove his general thesis by analysing the works of other political economists besides Marx or his sometimes quite loose responses to critical questions raised in the comments -- can be ignored. The lectures are meant to be the beginning of an intensified investigation into the realm of modern political economy. Hence, one can only hope that this book will find a wide reception in the humanities and will also come across some critical minds in contemporary economic sciences, which do not fear the ban that modern economists imposed on asking the most crucial question of their discipline.