The Weirdness of Being: Heidegger's Unheard Answer to the Seinsfrage

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Ivo De Gennaro, The Weirdness of Being: Heidegger's Unheard Answer to the Seinsfrage, Acumen, 2013, 194pp., $90.00 (hbk), IBSN 9781844655595.

Reviewed by Gary E. Aylesworth, Eastern Illinois University


This publication is a collection of essays and a dialogue between their author and Parvis Emad, all of which appeared in other venues between 2006 and 2011. Put succinctly, Ivo De Gennaro's premise is that the "other inception" of being that Heidegger anticipates in the 1930s actually occurred in certain texts that have now been made public in the Gesamtausgabe. These include the Beiträge zur Philosophie (1936-38), Besinnung (1938-39), Die Geschichte des Seins (1938-40), Über den Anfang (1941) and Das Ereignis (1941-42), which are of special interest because of their importance for the development Heidegger's thinking and for the fact that Heidegger kept them private during his lifetime. Instead of reading them as moments of an ongoing project, for which the other inception remains futural, De Gennaro claims that, in these texts, the event has already happened. As he states in his Preface: "The word of the Seinsfrage has found its answer in Heidegger's Denkweg. This means now that the German language is openly broken to its ownmost word." De Gennaro presumes, then, that Heidegger successfully articulated the event of being into German, and his own task is to correspondingly translate this event into English.

De Gennaro's strategy for translation is a mixture of English etymology, direct translations of Heidegger's German (including its syntax), his own neologisms, and others borrowed from the poetry of Gerard Manley Hopkins. The book's title, for instance, comes from De Gennaro's etymological understanding of the word "weird," or "wyrd," which in Old English means "fate" or "destiny." Hence "the weirdness of being" is his translation of Heidegger's Geschichte des Seins (commonly rendered as the "history of being"), which is the event (the Ereignis) of being itself. He also suggests that "being" should be rendered as "be3ng" with the Middle English yogh, which transcribes the Anglo-Saxon g-rune, meaning giving or generosity (p. 35). These elements often occur together in the same passage, as in: "This strangeness is of the only onset in that the onset's own schismatic biding is sheer ensconced awarkness (awk-ward), namely, the in-kept at-goinngness of the off-break" (p. 62).

And this is by no means the most convoluted of such passages. In his dialogue with Emad, which appears as the book's appendix, De Gennaro is clear about his lack of concern for general intelligibility. There, he states:

we need to remember that we are not translating for the general public, but only for being itself and, if for anybody, then for other thinking human beings. . . . This is why our principal preoccupation must be to devote ourselves to the task of thinking rather than catering to the demands of editors, the public, and the universities. (p. 142)

Let the reader beware, then, that De Gennaro's intended addressee is being itself, and if he addresses other human beings at all, it is only those few who qualify as "thinking."

A brief summary of the book's contents is as follows. In the Preface, the author introduces his notion of the "weirdness" of being and presents his thesis that being in its "selfhood" is the word, and that Heidegger has already rendered this word into German. The question is, then: "Has the English language been restored, that is, translated into its ownmost and earliest word, the word in which it answers the other onset of thinking?" (p. xiv). Chapter 1, "Why Being Itself and not Just Being?," sets forth the thesis that the event of the other inception of being (what De Gennaro calls "the other onset") has already occurred in the aforementioned "pentalogy" of texts Heidegger composed in the 1930s and 40s, and suggests that Heidegger's notion of being itself should be understood in terms of Hopkins' verb selving as "inwardly biding in its own truth" (p. 14). The chapter also introduces De Gennaro's unique translation of Möglichkeit as " likeliness," which is a subject of controversy between him and Emad in the Appendix.

Chapter 2, "Owning to the Belongingness to Being," includes the translation of Seyn as "be3ng" and the etymological connection between "to weird" and schicken. In chapter 3, "Translation, Tradition, and the Other Onset of Thinking," De Gennaro calls for an appropriation of the philosophical tradition as a transition into the other onset, and, in reference to Heidegger's statement that language stems from the parting (Abschied) of being and that language answers the inception, he authorizes himself to say:

thus is the mother-word of the schismatic saying of language. This mother-diction engenders the mother-language as such (and therefore the ownsome wyrd of a manhood) in that it firmly hands over the speaking of that language unto its wyrdly biding as a say of en-owning. (p. 58)

Chapter 4, "Husserl and Heidegger on Dasein," closely examines the status of the "da" (the "there") of being in Heidegger and in Husserl's transcendental phenomenology, in which the author notes that Husserl's notion of the da remains a matter of what Heidegger calls Vorhandensein, or the being of things that are objectively present, while Heidegger's sense of the da leads from the ecstatic "there" of the human being in Being and Time, to the Lichtung or "clearing" of the event of being in the later writings. De Gennaro suggests that the English translation of Heidegger's Dasein should not be "being there," but "there-being," where the word "there" is taken in the sense of "there is," which means the same as Ereignis, a sense he finds in the opening line of a poem by Emily Dickenson.

Chapter 5 is entitled "Minding that 'We' Cannot Ever Not Think Be3ng." Here, De Gennaro suggests additional translations of key words in Heidegger's German, and also suggests that the words "inscape" and "instress," taken from Hopkins, can be used to indicate traits of being, insofar as being is the inner form of something, and insofar as this form is self-shaping. He also comments upon alternative English translations of Ereignis, and decides that Emad's translation as "enowning" is testable as a seed that will either bear fruit in the English language or not, but that the alternative, "event of appropriation," is merely a valid semantic and informational computation. The only criterion for translation, he insists, must be Ereignis itself as the silent word of being. "This criterion," he says, "has nothing to do with comprehensibility, or manageability, or availability, or, in general, with effectiveness, or with semantic-informational values" (p. 99).

Chapter 6, "The Origin of Speech," follows up with a meditation on silence as an original stillness from which human speech arises, in which De Gennaro specifies that this silence belongs to being itself and is not reducible to the mere absence of human speech. There follows an Epilogue consisting of "seven questions" on Seyn, Geschichte, Unterschied, Da-sein, Ereignis, Wort, and Welt, and finally the Appendix, "Putting in the Seed," consisting of the dialogue between De Gennaro and Emad on the difference between Emad's "approximating" and De Gennaro's "interlingual" translations of Heidegger's key words. In the course of the discussion, Emad also raises the question of Heidegger's own interlingual translations, of Greek texts into German, for example, as well as his intralingual translations of key words found in Nietzsche or the German Idealists.

The prospective reader of The Weirdness of Being may be advised to begin with this appendix, for here is where De Gennaro lays out the aim of his entire project. It is, in fact, not just to find semantic and grammatical equivalences between Heidegger's German and certain statements in English, but to "say again" the Ereignis of being he believes to have already been said in specific texts of the Gesamtausgabe, the hitherto non-public manuscripts, for which he claims special status. This notion of "saying again" is the leading question of the dialogue.

Here, Emad raises the issue of an appropriate criterion for judging between translation and mistranslation, and wonders, in particular, about De Gennaro's translation of "likeliness" for "Möglichkeit." Such a translation, he notes, loses its referential dependency on the word of Heidegger, and thus risks its fidelity to Heidegger's thinking. De Gennaro responds that the point is not to transfer, absolutely or approximately, the semantic or conceptual sense of Möglichkeit into English, but to say Ereignis in a way that only English can say it, and hence to open up a uniquely English path for thinking (an English Denkweg). Despite their differences on translation, Emad and Gennaro share the same commitment to a certain kind of "Heideggerian" thinking and its key word, Ereignis, and they both single out the texts of the aforementioned "pentalogy" as this thinking's "true" utterance of being. This, however, raises certain presumptions that must be questioned.

One might begin with the privileged status of the texts they rely upon. In De Gennaro's presentation, this status is dogmatically asserted without reference to the relationship they have to Heidegger's "public" texts, that is, texts Heidegger published or delivered in his lectures, seminars, and speeches. Why should we assume that the private texts are, as it were, the enactment of an other inception of being, while Heidegger himself insisted to the end of his life that the other inception is yet to come, or that the question of its arrival must at best remain open? It is clearly better to say that Heidegger's understanding of the Ereignis and the other inception is a matter of the future perfect: if it happens, it will have happened. That is, we will experience it as already having happened, but there is no certainty as to whether it will happen, or when.

This brings me to the issue that is crucial for Heidegger when he addresses translation himself: what is the relationship between translation (whether intra-linguistic or inter-linguistic) and the experience of being? We know, for example, that in The Origin of the Work of Art he de-structures the Latin translation of Greek words (e.g., causa for aition) because the Roman translations lack the experience of being to which the Greek words correspond. This is the standard Heidegger sets: does translation lead us to an experience of being, does something of being show itself in the process, or does translation cut us off from this experience? It is certainly true that the possibility of this experience requires a transformation of language. But, more precisely, it calls for a transformation of our relationship to language, and Heidegger remarks, by way of warning, that "The transformation does not result from the fabrication of neologisms and novel phrases" (Basic Writings, 425). Furthermore, in the Protocol of his seminar on "Time and Being," he specifies that the attempt to develop a language that would say the simplicity of the word of being itself is not a matter we can talk about, but "(the) question is decided by the success or failure of such saying" (see "Summary of a Seminar," trans. Joan Stambaugh). What, then, constitutes success or failure?

The critical weakness of De Gennaro's project lies here. The strength of Heidegger's thinking is precisely its success in getting its matter to "show up." Its phenomenological power, as it were, depends upon connecting words, not just with other words, or the silent word of being itself, but with things -- a landscape, a painting, a jug, a classroom chair, a temple, a poem (a special case, to be sure), a hydro-electric dam, a country path, etc., all of which have their ways of silently speaking. That is to say, we cannot experience Ereignis without reference to a world of things in relation to which language has its provisional sense. (In his latest writings, does Heidegger not call his thinking Gelassenheit or "releasement toward things," and does he not say that phenomenology is a possibility of thinking?) Without these connections, words become mere words, and they occlude, rather than open, the experience of Ereignis that De Gennaro believes to have "said again" in his translations. If there is such an experience to be opened by the phrase "the weirdness of being," then De Gennaro needs to supply the phenomenogical showing we have come to expect from Heidegger himself. Otherwise, his translations amount to a logo-mystical theology, a secret revelation belonging to a priestly cult rather than a pathway for thought.