The Well-Ordered Universe: The Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish

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Deborah Boyle, The Well-Ordered Universe: The Philosophy of Margaret Cavendish, Oxford University Press, 2018, 273pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190234805.

Reviewed by Alison Peterman, University of Rochester


This is a book about one of the most exciting philosophers of the early modern period -- Margaret Cavendish -- by one of the very best scholars of Cavendish's philosophy. Deborah Boyle's work on Cavendish has been ground-breaking; it also happens to be deep, clear, sensitive, erudite, and creative. The book is Boyle's comprehensive study of Cavendish's philosophy, covering her metaphysics, natural philosophy, epistemology, ethics, and politics. But the book's polestar is what Boyle rightly identifies as the deep unifying theme of Cavendish's work: order. "Cavendish conceives of order and regularity as the highest goods" (6), Boyle writes, and Cavendish's concern with order and disorder pervades all aspects of her philosophy.

In the first chapter, Boyle defends this in general terms, arguing in the process for three controversial interpretive claims: first, that there are true disorders in nature; second, that Cavendish treats order as normative; and third, that order is a more central concern for Cavendish than is freedom. In the second chapter, she outlines Cavendish's early atomism and some of the reasons that Cavendish ultimately rejects it, paying special attention to her arguments that atomism cannot explain the order in nature. In the third and fourth chapters, we discover Cavendish's mature metaphysics, with the third chapter focused on infinite nature and the fourth on finite creatures. Cavendish argues that there is only matter in nature, and frequently pays lip service to the mechanist sentiment that everything can be explained by matter, figure, and motion. However, it turns out that a full account of matter, figure, and motion requires that some matter be essentially and basically self-moving, some sensitive, and some rational. The result is a fascinating hybrid built of some of the most rigorously reductionist materialist principles to be found in the period along with injections of vitalism in the surprising places where Cavendish thinks mechanism fails.

These two chapters provide a very useful overview of Cavendish's system, and further develop an interpretation of Cavendish's natural philosophy on which the behavior of bodies is explained by their free adherence to normative laws. I particularly enjoyed Boyle's formulation of a Euthyphro-type dilemma for Cavendish: if the laws of nature are normative, are they so because God dictated them, or is there "some other standard or goal to which the source of norms (God) is responding in deciding how the parts of Nature ought to behave" (113)? Boyle is asking about God's motivations, but I've always been puzzled by this question's close cousin: Cavendish clearly takes the natural to be normative, as against the artificial. But she doesn't really say why. Does the goodness of naturalness derive from God's goodness, for her? I'm inclined to think not. So then why is the natural the good?

Chapter 5 is about order among one particular subset of natural creatures: humans. Boyle mines Cavendish's writings outside of natural philosophy to argue that Cavendish thinks that human societies are more disorderly than nature in general, from the nuclear family ("Marriage is a curse we find/Especially to womankind") to institutions like churches and universities ("there are More, Oftener, and Continual Wars in Schools than in the Field, onely . . . their Weapons they use in Schools, are not so deadly") to warring states. Boyle wonders what has happened to the "passionate love" that binds every part of nature to the others. Her answer is given as part of a deep and convincingly-argued interpretation of Cavendish's view of human nature: it is the uniquely human love of fame that breeds disorder. It's useful to keep Cavendish's contrast between the natural and the artificial in mind when reading this chapter, too. Nature is a "Wise and Provident Lady" who "governs her parts very wisely, methodically, and orderly" (Observations on Experimental Philosophy, 105). Us, not so much. Maybe the reason that the natural is the good is that we always make everything worse.

The final four chapters are truly fascinating, fun to read, and information-rich. They beautifully integrate some of the weirder and wilder parts of Cavendish's philosophy -- which make reading Cavendish so pleasurable but whose philosophical value can be hard to appreciate -- into a systematic framework. Chapter 6 is a treatment of Cavendish's scattered writings on government, and Chapter 7 discusses her views about gender in society. Boyle diagnoses Cavendish as a conservative in both arenas, arguing that "her belief in the importance of regularity and order prevented her from encouraging social change" (166). It is worth noting that one passage that Boyle quotes to show that order is Cavendish's highest good is in fact part of a dialogue between Peace and War. It's true, Peace attacks War:

O War, thou cruell Enemy to Life,
Unquieted Neighbour, breeding alwaies Strife

But War accuses Peace of tolerating slavery and inequality. And War gets the last word in that dialogue. More generally: while I agree 100% with Boyle that order and disorder are central to Cavendish's philosophy, I am less sure that order in every sense enjoys the quite so univocally positive status that Boyle suggests.

In Chapter 8, Boyle shows how Cavendish's concern with order influences her views about the nature and proper treatment of animals and the rest of the natural world. It explains, for example, Cavendish's lovely proposal that each kind of creature has its own special kind of knowledge, that might be better in some cases than our own:

For what man knows, whether Fish do not Know more of the nature of Water, and ebbing and flowing, and the saltness of the Sea; or whether Birds do not know more of the nature and degrees of Air, or the cause of Tempests; or whether Worms do not know more of the nature of Earth, and how Plants are produced? (Philosophical Letters, 40; as cited in Boyle, 192).

Chapter 9 is about Cavendish's views of health and medicine. Her views on this topic, too, are cast in terms of harmony and order:

According to the 'Orderly course of Nature,' the human body should 'have a Perfect and Upright Shape, a Clear Strength, Sound Parts, Plump and Fat, Clean from Gross Humours and Obstructions' (226).

Disease is caused by "Mutinous and Rebellious humours" and cured by remedies that "endeavour to assist the Regular parts of the Body, and to perswade the Irregular Parts" (236).

These last passages about health illustrate something interesting about how Cavendish is using the concept of order. Sometimes 'order' just sounds like a general-purpose normative term for her, meaning nothing more specific than 'good' or 'OK'. Boyle argues in Chapter 1 that Cavendish does mean something more specific by 'order.' I believe, from pages 17-18, that Boyle takes 'order' and 'regularity' (and 'peace') to be synonyms for Cavendish. The closest to a definition of these I could find is when Boyle cites Cavendish's definition of irregular motions as "those motions which move not after the ordinary, common, or usual way or manner" or which are "not moving always after their usual and accustomed way" (as cited at 23). From this she concludes that 'regular' motions are "the usual and common ways in which parts of Nature move." So on Boyle's view, order is regularity in our sense, by which I mean that it involves lawlike behavior.

But when you look at all of the ways that order is supposed to be functioning for Cavendish, so admirably catalogued in Boyle's last four chapters, it is not obvious that they all involve anything like regularity in our sense. To the extent that these alleged cases of order have anything in common at all besides being cases of a system's being in a good state, it is that they involve harmonious behavior, not lawlike behavior.

There are two distinguishable -- and distinguished -- notions of order in circulation in the early modern period. One is lawlikeness or regularity in our sense: individuals behave similarly across time and space, and as a result we can predict and control them. The ability to formulate the general rules that govern nature is a special kind of knowledge of nature and the goal of natural philosophical explanation. But a different kind of order is nature's coordination. Individuals in nature seem to respond to each other as if they could perceive and communicate with one another. They make small adjustments in their motions based on differences in the states of a wide variety of other bodies, accommodating and harmonizing with one another, often at a distance. It was not obvious to natural philosophers of the period that what explains the one explains the other.

Cavendish makes very heavy weather of nature's coordination on the one hand, but frequently warns of fetishizing regularity, on the other. She claims to find law-talk inscrutable, complaining, against Descartes:

I cannot well conceive what your author means by the common laws of nature. But if you desire my opinion how many laws nature hath, and what they are; I say Nature hath but one law, which is a wise law, viz. to keep infinite matter in order . . . (Philosophical Letters, 146-147)

In fact, she thinks that attempting to identify regularities in nature is the most important source of philosophical error: "there's not anything that has, and doth still delude most men's understandings more, than that they do not enough consider the variety of nature's action" (Observations on Experimental Philosophy, 99). But what she does think is manifestly in need of explanation is nature's coordination, the fact that nature is harmonious, as is evidenced by the myriad examples that Boyle provides.

Now, what can explain harmony if not laws? That, it has often been thought, requires that particular bodies are sensitive to each other and are able to act directly on one another. Different sorts of forces have been invoked to realize this: sympathies and antipathies, vital or thinking matter, individual souls, a world soul. Cavendish toys with variants of all of these, and Boyle provides a particularly sensitive reconstruction in Chapter 2 of Cavendish's deployment of sympathetic and antipathetic forces in natural philosophical explanation.

But another strategy for accounting for order in nature is to say that nature is harmonious because it is not really many but one: the distinctness of creature is less fundamental than their unity. Then it's not harmony that needs explaining anymore; it is strife, variety and disharmony. So monism or explanatory holism is a solution. I think it is Cavendish's solution.

Boyle does discuss Cavendish's holism, especially in the context of her arguments against atomism. She endorses Karen Detlefsen's claim that one of Cavendish's central arguments against atomism is that it makes bodies too distinct from one another to be able to interact in an orderly way: if atomism were true, Cavendish writes, nature "would not be a body made of parts, but of so many whole and intire single bodies meeting together as a swarm of bees" or "a beggars coat full of lice." However, Boyle thinks that it is enough to make nature into a single whole that bodies follow the same laws: "There must be some kind of principle or principles to help coordinate the behavior of the parts in Nature -- but, in that case, the parts would not be truly independent of each other, and so atomism would not be true" (63).

I am inclined to think that part-whole relations play a much more fundamental metaphysical role than sympathetic relations or laws. Indeed I think that one of the most interesting and unique features of Cavendish's system is that she places mereological facts at its very center. So while Boyle writes, for example, that sympathetic relations between bodies, or the fact that they follow the same laws, ground the fact that nature is a whole, I think that for Cavendish, the relations between bodies are grounded in the fact that they are all parts of the same whole. Similarly, at the tree level, facts about parts of creatures are grounded in facts about which wholes they are parts of. Boyle writes that the "order and regularity in the whole is achieved through the diverse parts of nature following the principles or rules that prescribe how they are supposed to behave" (114). I think that nature is ordered in virtue of being a whole; it is not a whole in virtue of being ordered.

Boyle argues for "True Disorders" -- that there are really disorders in nature -- against "No True Disorders" -- that there are not, which has been defended by David Cunning and Lisa Walters. She discusses a number of Cavendish's texts which pull in competing directions, but does not discuss texts where Cavendish clearly associates disorder and irregularity with parthood, and order and regularity with the whole:

what we call irregularities in nature, are really nothing but a variety of nature's motions (Observations on Experimental Philosophy, 71).

There is perpetual war and discord amongst the parts of nature, although not in the nature and substance of infinite matter, which is of a simple kind, and knows no contraries in itself, but lives in peace . . . war is made by the division of nature's parts, and variety of natural actions, so peace is caused by the unity and simplicity of the nature and essence of only matter (Philosophical Letters, 280).

Cavendish associates strife and disorder with parthood and variety, writing that nature considered as infinite is perfectly regular, whereas considered as divided, it is irregular. Since parthood and variety are real, there is true disorder. However, because "a whole and its parts differ not really, but onely in the matter of conception" (cited at 22), understanding the relationship between order and disorder does require distinguishing nature under two different aspects, much like it does when Spinoza distinguishes between substance and its finite modes. This understanding of the relationship between order and disorder fits nicely with the idea that a concern with mereology is at the heart of Cavendish's metaphysics.

Finally, Boyle's book draws generously on the analogies that Cavendish makes between order in societies and order in nature. On Boyle's interpretation of Cavendish's natural philosophy, these are more than mere analogies. The behavior of bodies -- orderly and otherwise -- is explained, most basically, by their choosing or not to follow normative laws (though they usually do because they know what's good for them). So this interpretation requires attributing something like a belief-desire psychology to bits of matter, and using that to provide basic explanations of natural phenomena.

There is no shortage of passages that support this sort of interpretation, and Boyle marshals them masterfully. But I can't help feeling that there is something deeply disappointing if, according to Cavendish, explaining why bodies move as they do requires treating them as little agents. And there are alternative interpretations, which also enjoy textual support. Yes, matter has sense and reason. But at a first pass, matter's 'sense' is just whatever ability it has to register changes in other parts of matter. Its 'reason' is whatever basic capacity it has to respond appropriately to what it senses, as a body's mass is what allows it to respond appropriately to an impact. I'm not saying Cavendish is quite that reductionist, but this is a good place to start, and to ask: how far from this do we need to go, according to Cavendish, in attributing anything like cognitive states to matter?

There are plenty more fascinating questions like these raised in and by Boyle's rich interpretation of Cavendish's metaphysics. That her interpretation is delivered in such a well-written and engrossing work, with chapters exploring some of its most fascinating implications, is icing on the cake. I thoroughly enjoyed this book and I am very grateful to Boyle for having written it.