The Wild Region in Life-History

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Laszlo Tengelyi, The Wild Region in Life-History, Northwestern University Press, 2004, 222pp, $29.25 (pbk), ISBN 0810116618.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom, Boston University


In this inspired and intelligently written, if somewhat sprawling study, the author challenges the narrative view of the self (the equation of life-history and personal identity) in the course of arguing for “a transformed and renewed phenomenology” (81), one that takes its bearings from a hitherto hidden area (the “wild region”) in the historical unfolding of a life. This area encompasses the formation of sense, the unconscious, alterity, and the operative language and creative expressions that exceed the fixed meanings of common or shared experience. In the first half of the book, the author makes his case for this region through analyses of the “experiential sense in life-history” (chapter one) and the “temporality of experience in life-history” (chapter two). In the second half of the book, the focus shifts to alterity, as the author tries to integrate the “experience of alterity” (chapter three) into his account of the wild region in life-history and to sketch an “ethic of alterity” (chapter four) deriving from that region. The project is thus to establish the wild region of consciousness, first broached by Merleau-Ponty, and to bring it to bear effectively on the notion of unlimited responsibility, elaborated by Levinas. The result is a critical review and appropriation of French phenomenology by an independent voice from across the Rhine, paralleled in this regard only by the work of Bernard Waldenfels, whose imprint is present throughout the study. The text is a revised version of Der Zwitterbegriff Lebensgeschichte (Munich, 1998).

In the opening chapter “Experiential Sense in Life-History,” Tengelyi argues for a contrast between “the spontaneous emergence of a dispossessed sense” in lived experience with the “retroactive fixation of sense” necessarily underlying the conceptual and linguistic expression of that experience (3). Following Husserl, he understands ’sense’ in the broad sense of an inherently differential structure, the as-structure expressed by the phrase ceci en tant que cela. Rather than view the coincidence of identity and difference in this structure as a shortcut to metaphysics, Tengelyi urges us to take it as the structure of experiential sense, the experience in which something is revealed as something else. Experience on this account is the event in which some expectations are thwarted and a new sense formed; the phenomenology of experience is the elucidation of this event on the basis of commonly acquired dispositions. From the fact that a new sense emerges Tengelyi infers that it “cannot be reduced to any sense bestowal by consciousness” (9). In the course of differentiating his position from Hegel’s, Tengelyi suggests that this inference is sound provided that “the object is necessarily given in an intuitive way, i.e., independently of its conceptual identification” (9). Here he seems to have fallen into the Hegelian trap of thinking that conceptualization and linguistic expression are only retroactive and/or that they necessarily fall prey to conceptual dialectics. In any case, Tengelyi further argues that, with this notion of sense emergence independent of its bestowal by consciousness, phenomenology is no longer wedded to idealism. We cannot nor need we, Tengelyi contends, pretend to have a nonperspectival view of things in order to countenance a reality independent of experience. The frustration of expected senses suffices to demonstrate as much.

This break with Husserl’s idealism is only the beginning of the transformations of phenomenology proposed by Tengelyi. After taking critical note of the attempts by Fink and Patocka to emend Husserl’s phenomenology and their reasons for doing so, Tengelyi argues that the enormous difficulties noted by these authors (such as that of distinguishing content and object) ensue from assuming a strict correlation of noesis and noema, one that only holds, if at all, for a static analysis of experience. In order to give a more complete account, Tengelyi submits, it is necessary to heed the genetic dimension of experience and, with it, “the idea of a phenomenology of the unconscious inevitably arises” (19). According to Tengelyi, the genesis of sense points to the unconscious inasmuch as such sense-formation allegedly upsets, at least for a time, a noetico-noematic equilibrium. The call for a genetic phenomenology in this connection is certainly to be applauded, but Tengelyi fails to make clear how it is supposed to contribute to resolution of the difficulties mentioned (or expose them as pseudo-problems) or why the noetic-noematic correlation, suitably understood, fails to obtain in a genetic phenomenology. Moreover, while contesting the strict correlation of noesis and noema at one level, Tengelyi presupposes it at another, precisely to be able to identify the process of spontaneous sense formation. Yet to the extent that that strict correlation is deeply problematic, so, too, presumably is a conception of sense formation that presupposes it. (One also has to wonder about the precise meaning of ’unconscious’ in connection with the formation of sense: what sort of notion of consciousness is to be withheld here?)

Husserl creates further problems for himself, Tengelyi argues, by assuming a strong parallelism of conceptual meaning and experiential sense. That the parallelism does not hold is evident from Husserl’s own differentiation of a continuous perception from a categorical perception (and, correlatively, an identification performed in perception without an identity being meant). Emboldened by this distinction, Tengelyi submits that the as-structures of the two sorts of perception are “separated by an unbridgeable gap” (26). He even disputes that one has reason to speak of an analogy between the two structures, though he thereby finds himself in the tenuous position of resorting to the language of the categorical structure when he proposes to distinguish “quasi categories of experiential sense from categories of conceptual meaning” (27). What is a “quasi category” if not an analogous one?

Yet, with this distinction in place, Tengelyi turns to Merleau-Ponty’s way of transforming phenomenology precisely by challenging the parallel of conceptual expression and experience. The turn is not seamless since Husserl’s talk of noncategorial perception is simply left behind in favor of considerations of what Merleau-Ponty dubs “wild sense.” Wild sense can be described as the uncontrolled, creative offspring of the attempt to express oneself, irreducible to sedimented meanings. But it thereby stands for “a special kind of experience, namely the experience of expression, which serves as the expression of experience in general” (35). Wild sense and its creative expression thus serve for Tengelyi as the key to grasping reality “just as it arises from experience” (38). Hence, the move beyond the contrast between sensory and categorical intuition in Husserl, while not fully explained, becomes understandable. Tengelyi adds that, with the experience of expression, comes a realization that “an irremediablealterity keeps distinct experience and expression from each other” (38f). Exactly how the terms ’experience’ and ’expression’ are meant in this last connection is ambiguous, but Tengelyi removes some of the ambiguity by observing that the contrast between them is diacritical and not absolute. Experience challenges “all instituted expressions” because it abounds with sense (42). So, too, narrative, while expressing experience, does so selectively and never exhausts it and, consequently, “the narrative identity of the self necessarily presupposes a radical alterity which it is unable to absorb” (52). Taking issue with the theories of MacIntyre and Ricoeur, Tengelyi insists on distinguishing (retrospective) narrative from (prospective) action and recognizing how experience mediates as the delicate balance of a “changing equilibrium” between them.

Tengelyi develops his case for the radical alterity presupposed by narrative identity by turning first to the ambiguities attending Husserl’s reflections, in his investigations of time-consciousness, on the non-objectifying nature of consciousness of a primal impression. He does so as a means of developing the attempts by Levinas and Henry (despite their differences) to understand this notion positively and not merely as an abstract, ideal limit for time-constituting intentionalities. From Levinas’ reading of the primal impressions as “traces of an otherwise inaccessible origin” and Henry’s reading of them as “signs of a hidden, yet vigorously operating instinct,” Tengelyi sees further indications of a process, alien to consciousness, that is “always already a formation of sense in germinal shape” (77). Demonstrating the ways in which processes of sense formation (and, correlatively, the senses of “events” generally) emerge by themselves, always at a remove from the narrative fixation of self-identity, involves a reconfiguration of the field of phenomenology, a sublime phénoménologique in the words of Marc Richir to whom Tengelyi turns for guidance in this connection. A “destinal event” or crisis exemplifies such an emergence of sense initially at odds with fixed senses of identity and signaling a new beginning in a life-history. Tengelyi argues that, despite the interdependence of the processes of sense emergence and fixation, they do not fuse; instead the newly emerging sense escapes the scope of sense fixation and maintains an identity of its own, “to make its comeback later, from obscurity” (85).

This differentiation is underscored by the distinctive temporal structure of emergent sense. In this connection Tengelyi expands Richir’s account of the disequilibrium (“distortion originaire”) of time by insisting that, woven along with the chiasmus of retentional exigency and protentional promise, is a present that has never been a future, the temporality of destinal events. Why exactly this emendation of Richir is necessary to account for destinal events remains unclear, however, given Richir’s view of the present as an extended phase belonging to the emergence of sense. Also, in attempting to explain how emergent sense is retained as such (alien to narrative self-identity), Tengelyi seems to conflate the “newly emerging sense” that is not completely dissolved in the sense fixation typical of narrative self-identity and the “sense arousals” that have been pushed aside in the course of fixating the emergent sense.

Though Tengelyi does not feel comfortable taking a stand on whether the alterity within a life-history can be regarded as a model for understanding the alterity of the other, he does attempt to show how the latter can be “integrated” into his account of the relation between self-identity and life-history. In this connection he criticizes Ricoeur’s Oneself as Another for its failure to appreciate the radical alterity of the other, a failure that Tengelyi links to Ricoeur’s tacit appeal to a third-person perspective. After pointing up a basic ambiguity in Husserl’s account of the other as a modification of myself, Tengelyi shows how Merleau-Ponty’s idea of a “wild region,” initially applied in the context of interculturality and in spite of its occasional subordination to a holistic view of history, provides a way of overcoming difficulties with Husserl’s account. In this region what is one’s own and what is alien belong inseparably together, though not as a totality, but rather as their intertwining (chiasmus) and reversibility.

Still, the discovery of this region does not by itself establish the difference between what is one’s own and what is alien. To develop an account of this difference, Tengelyi turns to Levinas’ understanding of it as an asymmetrical, irreducibly ethical relationship, precisely as it develops from Totality and Infinity to Otherwise than Being. Tengelyi demonstrates that, for Levinas, the infinite responsibility engendered by the accidental encounter with the other is inevitably limited by the entry of a third party and, indeed, fades with the consolidation of that entry in a moral order, the ultimate justification of which derives from that very encounter. On the basis of these points Tengelyi argues that Levinas’ ethics leads back to politics “in the broadest possible sense,” namely, wherever issues of power and conflict arise and that, nevertheless, “the realm of the initially unlimited responsibility [that springing from the encounter with the other] remains once and for all withdrawn from the rule of law” (120).

The fact that this unlimited responsibility is limited by yet always distinct from the moral order (including the rule of law) requires that we alternate – seemingly from “nowhere”: Levinas’ non-lieu – between them. Tengelyi takes this Levinasian idea as the point of departure for the aim of his final chapter “to adumbrate a phenomenological approach to ethics” (123). “Adumbrate” is an apt choice here since there are more shadows than light in this sketch of an ethic of alterity. Tengelyi sees his task to be, in the first place, one of demonstrating how “wild responsibility” (the compulsory character of an appeal someone makes on us, attached to the saying and not the said) requires the law and vice versa. These clarifying ruminations are rudimentary but effective components of the overall argument. However, while each of the subsequent sections in this final chapter is interesting in itself, the connections among them and their respective import for the project of showing how the moral order is rooted in the wild region of life-history are largely left to the reader to devise. Tengelyi effectively argues against Ricoeur’s subordination of deontological to teleological ethics (“one of the main tenets of the theory of narrative identity”) and he gives a lucid exposition of Lacan’s psychoanalytical efforts to elaborate the positive relevance of desire for ethics. He does return briefly to the topic of wild responsibility in connection with an attempt to understand Levinas’ enigmatic remark about the good giving rise to the “desire of the undesirable,” though in this connection, too, the import of the discussion is, as Tengelyi seems to concede, largely negative (see page 163). In the final section of the final chapter Tengelyi attempts to bring the notion of the “wild region of a responsibility to the other” to bear on the traditional problems of evil and guilt. This final section contains some valuable reflections, building upon Levinas’ insight into the violence of the simplifying opposition of good and evil. After masterfully elaborating various notions of guilt that culminate in Levinas’ account of “irremissible guilt,” Tengelyi predictably suggests that “no concept of guilt can be opposed, as a unified and unequivocal notion of evil, to the ’good’“ (182). Tengelyi’s account trenchantly builds on the non-metaphysical parameters of the question loosely extending from Kant and Nabert to Levinas. Yet in this framework, one wonders, is there any place for the phenomena that traditional metaphysics deemed “natural evils”?