The Will to Imagine: A Justification of Skeptical Religion

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J. L. Schellenberg, The Will to Imagine: A Justification of Skeptical Religion, Cornell UP, 2009, 267pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780801447808.

Reviewed by James A. Keller, Wofford College


 In this book, the third volume in a trilogy on issues in the philosophy of religion, Schellenberg argues that faith in ultimism is the best rational response to religious questions that one can make in our current situation. This brief statement of his thesis requires some unpacking. He defines ultimism as “the claim that there is a metaphysically and axiologically ultimate reality (one representing both the deepest fact about the nature of things and the greatest possible value), in relation to which an ultimate good can be attained” (1). In the second book of the trilogy, The Wisdom to Doubt: A Justification of Religious Skepticism, he argued that in our current state of human thought and biological development neither belief nor disbelief in ultimism is rationally justified.

Schellenberg’s claim about the unjustifiability of belief in ultimism has important implications for the belief of basic propositions in all the particular religions of the world. For (Schellenberg claims that) ultimism is entailed by any basic religious proposition in any of the particular religions of the world (15). Indeed, Schellenberg makes this entailment a defining characteristic of religions (16). Thus, belief of any religious proposition, including ultimism, is not justified; therefore, Schellenberg advocates faith (not belief) in ultimism as the best response possible in this situation. He calls such faith skeptical faith. His purpose in this book is to argue that rather than either pure skepticism (i.e., skepticism without any faith commitment) or belief or faith in any particular religion, skeptical faith is the correct rational response in our current situation.

Schellenberg understands faith as involving two aspects: propositional faith and operational faith. Propositional faith “involves voluntary assent to a proposition, undertaken in circumstances where one views the state of affairs it reports as good and desirable but in which one lacks belief of the proposition” (3). In propositional faith one imaginatively actively represents to oneself the world as including the relevant state of affairs. This differs from belief, in which one is involuntarily and passively represented to (3). Operational religious faith “is realized when someone acts on propositional religious belief in pursuit of a religious way, or else on propositional religious faith” in pursuit of that way (4). Schellenberg has two main opponents for his claim about the superiority of skeptical faith: the pure skeptic, who has no faith in ultimism or any other religious proposition, and believers in some particular religion (what Schellenberg calls qualified ultimism).

Believers in a particular religion are likely to charge that belief in some religion is superior to faith in ultimism because the latter is too abstract to generate any more specific beliefs and too abstract to generate any religious activities that have not already been generated by other beliefs or faiths (e.g., a belief in morality or a faith in the intrinsic value of human beings). In response to this charge Schellenberg articulates beliefs entailed by ultimism, including the belief that there is a transcendent reality and that “the universe or our environment in the largest sense … is not indifferent to our deepest needs” (32). Moreover, “given the fact of deeply damaged human lives and earthly lives cut short,” salvation must include “some sort of afterlife for at least some of us” (32). Practices that he claims are appropriate consequences of faith in ultimism include the following: regularly calling to mind the state of affairs that would obtain if ultimism and its entailments were true as a source of consolation, encouragement, and motivation; consistently seeking a fuller understanding of what the ultimate, if one exists, might be like; being alert for what might be manifestations of the ultimate in the world and in the depths of one’s own experience; and seeking to discern and act in accordance with the good as part of one’s effort to be aligned with the salvific purpose of the ultimate. (These and other practices entailed by ultimistic faith are articulated on pp. 36-44.) Another appropriate consequence would be participating in a religious community in which one is supported in these activities and in which one can join with others in working for appropriate goals. Moreover, in comparison with believers in some specific religion, people with skeptical faith have the advantage of being more open to possible ideas about the ultimate in all religions, for their faith does not include any affirmations that require that they deny that doctrines in specific religions could possibly be true. (Of course, people with skeptical faith would have to deny any claim that it is appropriate to believe that any specific religions doctrines — including ultimism itself — are actually true.)

Schellenberg’s claim that in relation to possible specifications of the religious ultimate skeptical faith has the advantage of promoting greater openness than do particular religious beliefs might seem to make his own position vulnerable to an analogous charge by the pure skeptic. This analogous charge is that by choosing to have faith in ultimism religious skeptics would be less able to recognize any indications that ultimism is false. Schellenberg replies that religious skeptics have already found through careful investigation that at this time neither belief nor disbelief in ultimism is justified; therefore, it is appropriate to change their focus of investigation in religious matters from whether ultimism is true to the various actual and possible specific forms of ultimism, while keeping “an eye open” for reasons to think that ultimism is false (83). The results of such investigations are imagined ways in which ultimism might be true; imagining these ways, as well as imagining ultimism itself, is something the religious skeptic chooses to do. This is at least part of what is suggested in the primary title of this work, The Will to Imagine.

In chapters 6-11 Schellenberg discusses some arguments by six major figures in the history of Western philosophy of religion: Anselm, Leibniz, Paley, Pascal, Kant, and James. In relation to the first three, he argues that the argument associated with each (ontological, cosmological — more specifically the principle of sufficient reason — and teleological, respectively) does not succeed as a proof of theism, but with appropriate modifications the argument of each can provide support for adopting ultimistic faith. For example, from Anselm Schellenberg formulates “the aim of approaching as fully as possible a state in which one is aligned in one’s own being with that of anything ultimately real and valuable” (238). He does this by modifying Anselm’s argument to conclude that “the value and importance of something both ultimately real and valuable, if such exists, must be a (creaturely) value and importance than which a greater cannot be thought!” (112). From Leibniz he derives “the aim of promoting the conjunction of our various understanding-related interests (including cosmological ones) in the best available way” (238). And from Paley he derives the

the aim of doing the conjunction of the following four things as well as we can: paying tribute to the world’s beauty, doing justice to intense experiences of beauty, extending appreciation of the world’s beauty, and contributing to the cultivation of concern for the preservation of the world’s beauty (238).

In chapters 9-11 Schellenberg argues that the non-evidentialist reasons for theistic belief offered by Pascal, Kant, and James fail because, among other reasons, belief is an involuntary response and cannot be chosen, and choosing to try to come to believe, when this attempt succeeds, involves deliberate self-deception and a betrayal of reason. But out of his discussion of these three thinkers Schellenberg is able to derive reasons for skeptical faith. Again by modifying their argument he derives aims: from Pascal "the aim of readying oneself for ever deeper discoveries in connection with the Ultimate" (238, his italics), from Kant “the aim of carrying out a wholehearted commitment to the human good” (239), and from James "the aim of reconciling “the demands made on us” to avoid falsehood and “to discover and live by truths — especially important truths” (239).

In the final chapter Schellenberg groups these and other aims from chapters 6-11 into the

the aim of living a complete, well-rounded life — vigorously avoiding one-sidedness and narrowness by pursuing the ensemble of personal, moral, aesthetic, and intellectual aims that best permits us to accommodate all aspects of the unique complexity of human life (245).

He argues that these four aims can be so integrated that “one cannot form aims in one category without including something from the others” (249). Finally, he argues that this aim (as well as the others mentioned earlier) is worth pursuing, regardless of whether ultimism is true or not. He claims that reason requires that one pursue these aims, and he argues that the best way to pursue them is by adopting skeptical faith. This completes his argument to show that adopting skeptical faith is the best response in our current situation. He says that the “idea of an ultimate and salvific reality in which truth, goodness (of every sort), and beauty are necessarily in some way unified” can give us “a reason to assume” that each of the four dimensions of human life can and must be stretched to include the others (250); therefore, we should make a faith acceptance of ultimism and act accordingly.

Does Schellenberg’s argument in this volume succeed? Of course, a crucial part of the context for this final volume is the argument in the previous volume that neither belief nor disbelief in ultimism is justified at this time, but commenting on the adequacy of that argument is outside the scope of this review. I will confine myself to reservations arising from material in this third volume itself.

One of my reservations concerns whether ultimism is entailed by all religions. Of course, one can make this true by definition, as Schellenberg sometimes does (1, 16). But he does so at the cost of excluding some traditions that have been widely held to be religions. I have in mind in particular Mahayana Buddhism, which claims that the metaphysical ultimate is Emptiness. Emptiness has no qualities, so it cannot be ultimately good even if rightly relating to it is essential to salvation. I also wonder whether Nirguna Brahman, which some Hindus affirm is metaphysically ultimate but has no qualities, can be axiologically ultimate. Here in the West there are forms of Christianity that affirm both God and some analogue to a material ultimate (that of which all actualities, including God, are instances): e.g., process Christianity, which claims that creativity is the “material” ultimate. Although process Christians would say that God is both metaphysically ultimate (in one way) and axiologically ultimate, they would deny that creativity is axiologically ultimate, though it is metaphysically ultimate (in a different way than God is).

A second reservation is related to the first. As I noted above, Schellenberg sometimes writes as though it is part of ultimism to have faith that the ultimate somehow promotes human good. However, this would not be true in religions with a metaphysical ultimate that is not an axiological ultimate. Emptiness does not promote any goals; it has no agenda. While those who are saved by properly relating to such a metaphysical ultimate may themselves work for the good of all beings, they would not expect any help from the ultimate; it is indifferent to their deepest needs (though not irrelevant to meeting those needs). If there are religions that for these reasons do not entail ultimism, then it would seem that ultimists might not give these possibilities the same attention that they give possibilities that entail ultimism.

A third reservation concerns his conviction that ultimism entails life after death for at least some people. Schellenberg presents no sustained argument for the alleged necessity of an afterlife, claiming that it is obviously entailed by the goodness of the ultimate and the evils some people suffer in this life. But neither in this book nor in the previous one does he defend the possibility of life after death. Therefore, some of his readers may well find themselves still believing that there is no afterlife, and they may suspect that values derived from more specific beliefs of Western theism have led Schellenberg to allege this entailment. Moreover, some adherents of particular religions do not believe that there is an afterlife (e.g., adherents of nature religions and the Sadducees).

A fourth reservation concerns the many arguments about psychological states and motivations that are central to the third volume. Indeed, such arguments are probably more important than any others in this volume; it is, after all, an argument about the best way to live. Thus, it is quite understandable that Schellenberg focuses on claims about the possibility and desirability of being in certain psychological states, particularly affective and conative states. (Note especially what is said above about the final chapter.) Thus, one is led to examine with special diligence crucial steps in the arguments about these states. For example, can ultimistic faith provide the focus and strength of motivation for operational faith that belief in some more specific form of religion (e.g., Islam or Hinduism) provides? Schellenberg gives thoughtful arguments that it can (or in any instance when it cannot, he suggests that it offers benefits that outweigh any advantages particular religions might have). But these are empirical claims; they cannot be settled by philosophical arguments. The best that Schellenberg — and his opponents on these issues, for that matter — can offer is reasons to make their competing claims plausible. Schellenberg’s arguments might be enough to motivate some people to become religious skeptics; they cannot prove in advance that skeptical faith will work in the way Schellenberg claims. I am inclined to hope that some people do become religious skeptics; I would like to see how it works for them. I suspect that ultimistic faith, like other religious options, will work for some people and not others; much depends on how many people try it and how many of them find that it works for them. But my suspicion is itself another empirical claim; only time will tell whether it is correct.

The position defended in these three volumes is a bold and original thesis. In this third volume the originality of the thesis is matched by the high quality of the argumentation, the many original insights into the work of earlier thinkers, the many carefully drawn distinctions, and the care and thoroughness with which relevant objections are considered. It is impossible to convey in a brief review the richness of this work. It deserves to be high on the soon-to-be-read lists of philosophers of religion.