Philosophy, William James said, “works in the minutest crannies and opens out the widest vistas.” And the point applies especially to the history of philosophy, where we have (and need) a bird’s eye view of entire oeuvres, but also close studies of more modest scope and ambition—if only to keep the high-fliers honest. In the book under review, Bernard Reginster aims at something of a sweet spot: a bird’s eye view of a single text. He is concerned to extract from the pages of what he regards as Nietzsche’s “most cohesive and self-contained book” (1) a focussed critique of morality, the nub of which is this: morality lets ressentiment look good; and it’s a fatal attraction.
Reginster’s thesis is bold, and his arguments for it are often ingenious and regularly thought-provoking. As an interpretation of On the Genealogy of Morality, however, this book meets with only partial success, for reasons I shall elaborate below.
Reginster takes his title and his cue from Nietzsche’s description of morality as a danger to the future of humankind—"its most sublime lure and seduction—into what? Nothingness?” (Preface §6). Reginster’s “framing assumption” is that the genealogies of the particular moral concepts and values that Nietzsche elaborates are “‘psychological studies’” concerned to elucidate “the functional role that the Christian moral outlook . . . is well-suited to play in the emotional economy of moral agents . . . beset with a feeling of impotence by chronic frustrations” (vi). When Nietzsche calls “the value of moral values” (Genealogy Preface, §§3, 6) into question, he has, according to Reginster, a functional standard of value in mind (4), and his deepest and most effective objections to morality are pragmatic, not epistemic or ontological. A certain amount of scholarly lore to the contrary notwithstanding, Reginster interprets Nietzsche’s interest in moral judgment as rooted, not in questions of their possible truth or plausibility, but in the question whether or not they are “beneficial or harmful to [those who make them and live by them]” (41). Being in the business of meeting psychological needs, moral values earn their keep, or don’t, to the extent that they do this job well, or ill.
On Reginster’s interpretation of Nietzsche’s account, morality is provoked by lingering ressentiment, a noxious affective state rooted in our “peculiar ‘instinctive’ tendency to construe suffering as demeaning or degrading, as a challenge to [our] standing in the world” (50). When we suffer, we feel diminished and bereft. If we could feel empowered and imposing instead, things would look better; and believing that we are morally good—or are at least trying to be good, or at least knowing what it is to be morally good—enables us to think that things are looking better, and therefore, by a fallacious emotional logic, to feel more empowered and imposing. Moral values seem to keep ressentiment at bay, but that’s the very most that they can do, and in the longer run they do much less than that.
Employing something akin to a method of successive approximation (in Susan Haack’s sense), Reginster’s Nietzsche hones and deepens his inquiry by successively expanding the scope of the suffering it seeks to comprehend. In the Genealogy’s First Essay, sufferings resulting from “the deprivation of a ‘higher’ social and political standing” give rise to the slave revolt in morality; in the second, sufferings attendant upon “the constraints imposed by socialization on the pursuit of instinctual satisfaction” give rise to bad conscience; and in the third and final essay, sufferings that are part of the human condition, the myriad “injuries, failures, privations, sicknesses, and losses that are the inevitable lot of human beings,” give rise to ascetic ideals (162). At the bottom of the problem of ressentiment is the Schopenhauerian problem of suffering; and at the core of Nietzsche’s critique of morality is the contention that it is a fateful and grotesquely unsuccessful attempt to solve this problem. In fact, morality exacerbates the predicament it is meant to ameliorate: “the barbarians” Nietzsche writes in Daybreak, “were happier”, and civilized moralities, far from reducing human suffering, have compounded it gravely.
In Reginster’s rendering of it, Nietzsche’s critique shows morality to be, not merely incapable of carrying out its assigned function, but actively complicit in undermining it. Moral values don’t just do a poor job of solving the problem they are supposed to solve, they do an (in)glorious job of making it worse! The intricacies of the argument for this bracing conclusion will be set aside here, but they unfold against the backdrop of three different ways in which people can cope with “the feeling of impotence in the face of suffering” (75). The first of these ways is that of the warrior nobles of the Genealogy’s first essay, the motto of which is: “Don’t let it happen! And if it does, do something about it”; the second, that of the well and truly beaten, takes the form of what Reginster calls “shameful resignation” (75): “Can’t fight it; gonna happen anyway”; and the third is that of “men of ressentiment”, who stew and plot and avenge themselves by inventing morality.
Ressentiment values culminate in the principled devaluation of our natural desires and our whole being as “mere products of nature” characteristic of ascetic ideals. Not only do such ideals require a fantastical metaphysics to make any sense; they are psychologically self-defeating. In fulfilling the requirements of their own office and carrying out their defining function of restoring “damaged feeling[s] of power”, ascetic moral values can achieve only Pyrrhic victories of increasingly catastrophic proportions; for the regimes required to live by them “cannot be sustained without a dramatic and ‘life-destructive’ decrease in energy and vitality” (185, emphasis added). The more you try to live up to an ascetic ideal, the weaker and more “depleted” you get, until, eventually, you stop being able to see even “the suppression of [your] natural desires as an achievement, a demonstration of mastery or effective agency” (185). The men of ressentiment who began by kicking vigorously and surprisingly effectively against the pricks end up succumbing to them entirely, lapsing into the ranks of the well and truly beaten. Charged with the task of restoring power, morality ends up losing the ability to provide even the mere feeling of power, much less the genuine article. That is why “Christian morality may be denounced as an enduring ‘danger’ to ‘the future of the human being’” (188).
Morality, then, fails on its own terms, or so Nietzsche as read by Reginster believes. But whose morality are we talking about? Alternatively, who are these men of ressentiment who need morality to stave off nihilistic confusion and despair? The answer to this last question is: us, modern men and women. The ascetic ideal having not yet found a worthy successor or competitor, we remain susceptible to the spiritual enervations that make morality look so good, as an excellently chosen aphorism from The Gay Science (§359, “The Revenge Against Spirit [Geist] and Other Moral Motivations”), cited by Reginster in his Introduction as the “inspiration” for Nietzsche’s critical approach to morality, amply testifies. Given this, however, the fact that what is denounced in the ringing sentence quoted at the close of the previous paragraph as a danger to the future of human beings is Christian morality specifically raises eyebrows. For while it would beggar belief to claim that we are post-ressentiment, it isn’t so implausible to think that we are post-Christian. So when Reginster declares that Christian morality poses a danger to all and sundry because “the ‘depression’ to which it constitutes a self-defeating response is a chronic consequence of essential features of the human condition” (188), the inverted commas around “depression” and the traditionalist baggage attendant upon talk of “essential” features of the human condition conspire to raise questions about what exactly is being claimed and whether or not it’s true.
The ascetic ideal is supposed to be “at the core of the moral outlook” (155), and yet, in its “modern secular variants,” is present only in “much attenuated forms” (154). How an ideal can continue to animate a culture in an attenuated or vestigial state is a good question that might have appeared higher on Reginster’s agenda than it does. In explaining why the Genealogy’s treatment of the ascetic ideal dwells so exclusively on its more “extreme” forms, he says that aggressively ascetic ideals have been hugely influential, and observes that this is itself “puzzling”: How could an ideal that “unconditionally demands systematic and unrelenting self-denial” have proven so attractive (155)? How indeed! But no amount of progress with this question will tell us how, if at all, modern, atheist, and secular moral values are self-defeating. For the considerations appealed to in the argument for how unabashed ascetic values by nature sap the energy and vitality they are supposed to enhance seem to apply chiefly, perhaps only, to their unabashed forms. If the self-defeating argument works, it establishes that if you maintain that “what is most valuable in life transcends, and therefore excludes in whole or in part, the satisfaction of natural human ‘instincts’ and of the desires to which they give rise” (156–7), then you will end up depriving yourself of any meaningful sense of agency. But what if you don’t maintain this? Or at least don’t think that your moral values require you to?
Either the full strength versions of the life-denying responses to the threat of ressentiment fomented by ascetic priests are doing work for Reginster’s self-defeating argument or they aren’t. If they are—and the flurry of supporting citations to those sections of Genealogy III (11–22) where Nietzsche subjects such responses to withering scrutiny suggests that they very much are—the argument that morality is a fateful exercise in futility has a fighting chance of success. But until we know how it is supposed to undo moral outlooks not invested in serious self-denial, the result will be a critique with a much narrower scope than Reginster (or Nietzsche) imagines. And if—perhaps in line with the “in part” qualification to the identification of ascetic idealism with the view that what’s valuable in life excludes the satisfaction of natural instincts and desires “in whole or in part”—the argument is supposed to undermine diluted, etiolated, “sublime” incarnations of the ascetic ideal, in the form of present-day moralities willing, or at least trying, to respect the full gamut of human needs (material as well as intellectual, sexual as well as spiritual, etc.), we need to know how the trick is turned.
It can be granted, enthusiastically, that understanding our ascetic heritage—how it was possible, how it grew and developed, how it is still with us in disguised forms—is philosophically important. In this book, however, it is only the first of these questions, the high philosophical “conditions for the possibility of X” question, that receives attention. Questions about the actual historical conditions—long ago when slave values first arose, right now in the midst of what Nietzsche elsewhere aptly calls a “moral interregnum” (Daybreak)—go begging. As Reginster is well aware, his interpretation of Nietzsche’s critique of morality requires a shift of focus from questions of emergence to questions of persistence. While we might have expected a genealogy of morality to be occupied mainly with historical questions about the emergence and development of moral values, Nietzsche’s book on this subject is in fact (Reginster argues) concerned to analyse and understand how and why these values have persisted (34).
If the values of atheist, secular moralists are self-defeating, it must be because core features of the ascetic ideal continue to underpin them, as they may well do. For my part anyway, the observation that hard-won intellectual triumphs over Christian theology can be motivated by, and engender, an ever firmer commitment to Christian morality—"apart from the Church we too love the poison” (Genealogy I §9)—ranks among Nietzsche’s deepest and most original insights. But given the importance of this to his argument, Reginster isn’t entitled to set it aside as briskly as he does: “In order to maintain a relatively tight focus”, he has left “Nietzsche’s discussion of the ideal of truthfulness” out of his ambit on the grounds that “it is only a particular instance of the ‘ascetic ideal’” (3, emphasis added). As the article of his to which he directs readers for his views on this subject testifies, this “only” cuts a long and complicated story very short. (And in any case, the problem of how the self-defeating argument is supposed to apply outside unapologetically ascetic contexts isn’t solved in the earlier piece, if only because that argument doesn’t figure within it).
Besides all this, three structural features of On the Genealogy of Morality stand in the way of the rigorous priority Reginster gives to persistence over emergence in his account of its critique of morality, and belie the enticing idea that ressentiment is “the unifying thread running through all three [of its] genealogical inquiries” (3). First, the book’s first two tracts are manifestly more historically oriented than its third, and are accordingly at least as concerned with questions of origination and emergence as with questions of persistence; second, the discussions of ressentiment in its first and third essays are very different from one another; and third, there is little mention of ressentiment in its Second Essay.
Beginning with the last point, I turn to Reginster’s interpretation of Nietzsche’s discussion of “‘Guilt’ ‘Bad Conscience’ and the Like” in in his fourth chapter, “Guilt and Punishment”. According to Reginster, Nietzsche’s ultimate ambition in this portion of the Genealogy is to “elucidat[e] the functional significance of [the concept of ‘guilt before God’]” (148–9); the book’s second essay builds on its first by showing how, having gained a foothold by ministering to the evident satisfactions of blaming others for injuries and misdeeds, ressentiment-inspired values end up engendering a perverse sort of satisfaction in blaming oneself for being human. Guilt before God, the “maximal God” of Christian worship, is inevitable and inexpiable. And the book’s middle essay prepares the way for its closing essay by showing how a conception of human beings as desperate sinners is rooted in the demands of human socialization and the interpretation of “suffering under the perspective of guilt” (172).
To blame oneself for something is to feel guilty for having done it, and Reginster places weight on the idea that this superficially unpleasant experience can, paradoxically, have the “defensive function” of protecting one’s sense of agency. As he observes, this idea has figured more prominently in the psychoanalytic tradition than in the writings of mainstream philosophers; and I found the running dialogue, conducted in footnotes, between themes in the Genealogy and themes in psychoanalytic theory to be a highlight of Reginster’s book. In the Genealogy’s Second Essay, we are (Reginster argues) shown how the defensive function of guilt works hand in glove with a conception of punishment “as an alternative way of living up to . . . evaluative commitments” (124): when I fail to live up to an evaluative commitment, I feel guilty; and while I can’t undo the failure, since it lies in the past, I can accept punishment for it now. And if accepting punishment, or indeed, inflicting it on myself, is a way of living up to my commitments, then the initial misconduct, about which I’m powerless to do anything, turns out to be a failure in only a Pickwickian sense. Perhaps better, I can now think that, while I may have failed, I am not a failure. By submitting to punishment, I make amends, and thereby exercise the moral agency that would otherwise be imperilled.
More expansively, in Reginster’s view, the point of the Second Essay of the Genealogy is: firstly to establish that the experience of guilt and the institution of punishment emerge from the enforcement of promissory-contractual relations (in accord with the transmutation of Schuld as debt into Schuld as guilt); which means, secondly, that punishment comes to be viewed as a surrogate means of repaying debts; in the wake of which, thirdly, a conception of punishment according to which it “expunges . . . guilt” (141 emphasis in original) takes shape so that the defensive function of guilt becomes thoroughly insinuated into our thought and practice. And where is ressentiment in all this? Unfortunately for this neat story, at a critical point Nietzsche says explicitly that it isn’t to be found.
About half-way through his wide-ranging discussion of his titular subjects, Nietzsche finally tells us that, at root, bad conscience is a consequence of aggressive instincts turned inwards in the wake of the need to live in a community according to social norms, as opposed to “in the wild” according to animal instincts. He takes pains to insist that this “original socialization” (147) of the human animal must have taken place too suddenly to allow any struggle against it, or even any ressentiment. As Reginster duly grants, this “seems to go against the grain” of his interpretation of the text in question. In response, he conjectures that “the suddenness and violence of original socialization [may have left] its victims initially bewildered” so that an appreciable period of time would need to elapse “before they [were] able to reflect on their new predicament and experience the ressentiment Nietzsche elsewhere presents as a common characteristic of individuals who have been forced into an organized social group (or ‘herd’)” (147–8). The “elsewhere” to which the reader is directed, where Nietzsche is said to present ressentiment as endemic to human herds, is in the Genealogy’s Third Essay; and in dealing with his textual problem thus, Reginster conforms to a pattern: encounter a difficulty posed by something Nietzsche says in his first two essays, draw attention to something he says in the third. Which brings us to the differences between the Genealogy’s First Essay and its Third Essay.
The Genealogy’s First Essay, on the contrast between a morality of “good and bad” (noble morality) and a morality of “good and evil” (slave morality), and its Third Essay, on the meaning of ascetic ideals, each assigns a prominent role to ressentiment and has much to say about priests. But the priests are not the same priests, and the ressentiments may not be identical either. In the First Essay a priest is the occupant of an office; in the Third Essay he is the embodiment of a psychological type (which of course explains the preeminent role assigned to this tract in Reginster’s account of Nietzsche’s book). In the Third Essay the ressentiment of the ascetic priest is “unparalleled”; in the First Essay the ressentiment of the instigators of the slave revolt in morality is creative. Both adjectives apply in both cases, but the differences in focus and accent are of the essence. The ressentiment of the ascetic priest is unparalleled in its metaphysical ferocity, and creative in its psychological acuity; that of the instigators of the slave revolt in morality is unparalleled in its historical originality, and creative in its conceptual resourcefulness.
If we are to understand On the Genealogy of Morality, we must understand how the ressentiment that gives rise to slave morality and the ressentiment that animates the ascetic priest bear on each other. In effect, Reginster takes Nietzsche’s pronouncements in the Genealogy’s final essay to be definitive. The “‘priestly ressentiment”’ (the scare quotation marks are Reginster’s own, and are needed because, as I suspect he is aware, this description of the chief locus of the ressentiment behind the slave revolt is tendentious and has been contested in print) that prompts revenge against the heroic values of warrior nobles is, he writes “only an example” of the phenomenon, and the “clues” about its nature and source offered in the Genealogy’s First Essay “should be understood in the context of the account of [these things] which Nietzsche sketches [in the Third Essay]” (50), presumably on the grounds that it is there that “Nietzsche most explicitly develops a functional critique of the moral outlook that emerged from Christianity” (155). If we assume that functional critique is the Genealogy’s first order of business, this rationale can pass muster; but if we don’t, it may not—which enables me to conclude where I began: by averring that, while Reginster’s book argues for a bold thesis in original ways, it fails to advance our understanding of the book it proposes to interpret as much as might have been hoped.
I would like to thank the several readers of an early draft of this review for a raft of telling and helpful criticisms, and Jessica Berry and Paul Loeb for astute and detailed comments on later drafts.
James, William (1907). Pragmatism: A New Name for Some old Ways of Thinking. Lecture One.
 I follow Reginster here in rendering Nietzsche’s Erste Abhandlung” by “First Essay” (and correspondingly for the Second and Third Abhandlungen/Essays). There is irony here in that an Abhandlung is by nature a piece of scholarly or scientific work, and therefore stands in marked contrast to an essay, a distinctly more exoteric, “unwissenschaftlich” literary form. (When G.E. Moore wrestled with the task of translating Wittgenstein’s Logische-Philosophische Abhandlung into English, he gave up and resorted to Latin!) And there is further irony in describing Reginster’s book as “An Essay on Nietzsche’s Genealogy”, when its tenor and scholarly trappings make it far more like an Abhandlung.