The Wonder of Consciousness: Understanding the Mind Through Philosophical Reflection

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Harold Langsam, The Wonder of Consciousness: Understanding the Mind Through Philosophical Reflection, MIT Press, 2011, 234pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262015851.

Reviewed by Adam Pautz, University of Texas at Austin


Since the 1990's, scores of books on consciousness have appeared. But Harold Langsam's new book is distinctive.

Langsam begins by suggesting that reductive materialism is almost certainly false. Instead, consciousness and the "sensible properties", he says, are just obviously simple, fundamental elements of reality (21, 31), over and above the fundamental physical properties, such as mass and charge. In opposing reductive materialism he sides with David Chalmers, Tim Crane, Mark Johnston, Joseph Levine, Thomas Nagel and many others. But to his credit Langsam insists that rejecting reductive materialism is not enough. His main purpose is to develop a positive alternative picture, on the basis of a priori reflection alone (15-16).

Briefly, Langsam favors what might be called a "consciousness-first" program: consciousness is not something that must be reductively explained in other terms, but rather a starting point from which to explain other things, such as world-directed intentionality, rationality, and value. This goes against what had been the standard order of explanation. Many reductionists (David Rosenthal, Peter Carruthers, Gareth Evans, Fred Dretske, Michael Tye) take thought or reason to be explanatorily prior to consciousness and then explain the difference between an unconscious representation in the brain and a conscious experience by saying that a conscious experience is a representation of the world that is immediately accessible to conceptual thought, or that is available as a reason for forming judgments and performing actions. Langsam also recognizes a constitutive connection here but reverses the order of explanation: our conscious experiences of the world explain and make possible the relevant thoughts and reasons for judgment and action, not the other way around. Indeed, his central idea is that, in the mental realm (but not in the non-mental, physical realm), we should endorse an anti-Humean, rationalist view of causation: some causal-explanatory connections between conscious states and distinct mental states (beliefs, desires) are metaphysically necessary and discoverable through a priori reflection alone. He applies this idea to some debates in epistemology.

I am generally sympathetic. I will describe his ideas more fully, raising questions along the way.

Langsam's direct realism and anti-reductionism

Langsam begins (chapters 1 and 2) by defending direct realism and anti-reductionism about our consciousness of the external world. He considers both doctrines crucial to his overall view that consciousness has a special explanatory significance in nature as an intelligible source of world-directed thought, rationality and value.

Since the 17th century mathematization of the external world, many thinkers have re-located the sensible properties (sensible colors, tastes, audible qualities, etc.) inside the mind or brain. On some such internalist views of conscious experience, it becomes difficult to see how conscious experience makes world-directed thought and knowledge possible. Against such views, Langsam advocates a return to direct realism. For instance, redness is a "simple" quality "spread out on" the surface of a tomato; it is grounded in (but not identical with) the "microstructural" state of that surface (31). When you look at a tomato, your neural processing enables you to be directly conscious of such "observable properties being instantiated" in the tomato (44, 55). But his direct realism goes beyond this (44, 56): on the basis of a priori reflection, he also claims that, in non-hallucinatory cases, the "phenomenal properties" of experiences are "intelligibly grounded in" what worldly property-instantiations you are directly conscious of out there in the world. (Presumably, you are directly conscious of such a property-instantiation just in case your brain appropriately causally detects it.) So, in non-hallucinatory cases at least, the character of experience is inherited from the character of the world. As Langsam notes (194), others (e.g., John Campbell, Mark Johnston and Michael Martin) defend such industrial-strength direct realism.

This radical direct realism faces problems. What about hallucinations in which you don't perceive the world at all? Langsam briefly suggests disjunctivism: "the observable properties that determine phenomenal properties of experiences are either properties of experienced physical objects (in the case of non-hallucinatory experiences) or some other kind of thing (in the case of hallucinatory experiences)" (44). Langsam calls these other things "mental objects" and "images" (p. 35), suggesting non-physical sense data, but he is not explicit.

What about illusion and perceptual variation? Langsam adopts qualitative pluralism about the external world. Even in illusion "an observable property is perceived [in an object]": the world is the way it looks (46). He only gives one example: a white wall that looks red to you because it is illuminated by red light "is in fact instantiating the property of sensory redness" (45), and it is this you directly perceive. He doesn't consider other cases. For example, tomatoes look red to us. Pigeons have photoreceptors sensitive to UV light. Arguably, when they view a tomato, they seem to perceive some quite different color pasted on its surface. Maybe, on Langsam's pluralistic direct realism, the tomato possesses both the color red and this other color, and the perceptual variation between humans and pigeons derives from the fact that our different brains enable us to causally pick up on, and thereby to be directly conscious of, those different but equally real colors of the tomato. But how might Langsam's direct realism handle color blindness, the effects of perspective, "impossible illusions" like the waterfall illusion (in which an object appears to both move and stand still, so the world simply cannot be the way it looks), and non-visual experiences (taste, smell, etc.)?

Langsam also misses an important empirical problem for his direct realism. Take color vision. The resemblances among the colors we perceive are not at all well matched by any objective resemblances among the light-involving properties of external objects (creating a problem for Langsam's color objectivism). If nothing external to the brain explains the patterns of perceived colors similarities, then what does? There is evidence that chromatic processing in the brain provides the explanation of perceived similarities and discriminatory patterns (Brouwer and Heeger 2009; Danilova and Mollon 2012). But this internalist explanation goes against Langsam's direct realism.

To make the problem vivid, suppose that a human and some hypothetical non-human animal view a tomato on some background foliage. Suppose that their relevant internal chromatic processes and color-related behavior differ. Yet let us also stipulate that (unlike in the aforementioned human-pigeon case) their different cortical neural processes are appropriately caused by exactly the same chromatic properties ("color-looks") and relations instantiated out there by the tomato and the foliage. (Compare: different thermometers, with different internal workings, can nevertheless track the same external temperatures.) What would Langsam say about these individuals? Even if Langsam's chromatic pluralism is correct and there are multiple chromatic properties out there, he must apparently say that in this case the individuals' neural processes (although different) enable them to be acquainted with the same ones from the same point of view, so that his direct realism dictates that the individuals have exactly the same color experiences of all the items in the scene. But, since the perception of color and color-similarity is best explained by the brain rather than by anything in the external world, the more reasonable verdict is that they would have different color experiences of those items. The science of taste, smell and sound counts even more strongly against direct realism about these other sense-modalities.

Langsam's theory of consciousness is also in some quite strong sense "anti-reductive". Roughly, Langsam holds that there is no "real definition" or "metaphysical analysis" that specifies the "essence" of consciousness in non-mental terms (12-13). So, there is no true identity claim of the form "to be conscious of a quality just is to be in complex physical/functional state P". In that sense, Langsam says that consciousness is special in nature in that it is an "extra", "fundamental" feature of the macro-world (13). (By contrast, Langsam might say that there are true reductions of other macro-features like being alive or being a mountain in more fundamental "physical" and "functional" terms, even if they are far too complex for us to specify.) Langsam also holds that the sensible properties we are conscious of, such as sensory redness, are fundamental or "primitive" (31; also 193, n.2). Interestingly, Langsam thinks that, by having conscious experiences and introspecting, we can just immediately tell that consciousness and the sensible properties are fundamental, without recourse to arguments (16-24). Other anti-reductionists might be more impressed by the dismal history of failed reductive theories of consciousness and intentionality.

Langsam (21-23) acknowledges that there are arguments against his anti-reductionism. But he might have said more about a troubling explanatory problem. On anti-reductionism about consciousness, there are innumerable principles of the form: when an individual has neural or functional property P, then as a result the individual has irreducible conscious property C (e.g., being conscious of sensory redness). As Langsam notes, there are two interestingly different forms of anti-reductionism, which view these principles differently (13-14). On traditional dualism, the principles are just contingent psychophysical laws. By contrast, on what might be called "emergent materialism", the principles are metaphysically necessary "grounding laws". That is to say, whenever an individual has physical-functional property P, this necessarily "determines" or "grounds" his having conscious property C, in the sense that the individual has C by virtue of having P. Nevertheless, on emergent materialism, as on dualism, consciousness remains "fundamental and "extra" in Langsam's sense: there is no (bi-conditional) reduction of it that specifies its "essential nature" in non-mental terms. (Compare: Moore held that that the instantiation of goodness is always "grounded in" various natural properties, but he nevertheless also held that goodness is fundamental in the sense of being irreducible to such natural properties.)

Langsam doesn't decide between dualism and emergent materialism. But no matter which form of anti-reductionism he chooses, he faces the explanatory objection I have in mind. The crucial point is that these innumerable principles (whether they be dualist laws or grounding laws) cry out for further explanation: if conscious properties are not reducible to (not identical with) physical-functional properties, as Langsam holds, why are they necessarily connected with them in just these ways? Yet Langsam apparently cannot provide any explanation of the principles; instead, he must accept them as basic in the sense that they do not follow from any more basic truths. Of course, we all must admit some basic nomic and metaphysical necessities (the fundamental physical laws, the necessities of logic and mathematics, various others), but Langsam's anti-reductive approach to consciousness requires innumerable additional basic necessities, ones that cry out for some explanation. (They also arguably resist any simple systematization: see Adams 1987.)

The reductionist has an explanatory advantage over Langsam here: on the reductionist's view, a conscious property C is just identical with a physical-functional property P. So he can provide the desired explanation of their necessary connection. And such identities (or reductions) are unique in that they do not in turn "cry out" for further explanation -- they are explanation-stoppers. Indeed, as many have noted, an identity of the form C=P isn't the sort of thing that is apt for explanation (although of course the distinct fact that our representations 'C' and 'P' co-refer can be explained). So they are much more appealing than Langsam's basic dualist laws or grounding laws, which, as we saw, positively demand some deeper explanation. Of course, others have raised additional problems for anti-reductionism about consciousness, for instance, puzzles involving vagueness and fundamentality (Armstrong 1968, 47-48) and luck (Latham 2000, 75-76). Langsam claims (21-22) that his immediate introspective justification for anti-reductionism is so strong that he is entitled to think all such arguments against it must contain a mistake somewhere. However, to achieve his stated aim of a "full-fledged" anti-reductive theory (15), Langsam could have sketched an anti-reductive theory that takes a stand on just where arguments against it might go wrong.

Langsam's consciousness-based explanatory claims

After developing an anti-reductive, direct realist theory of consciousness, Langsam puts consciousness to explanatory work (chapters 3-5). One of his ideas is that, while many psychological generalizations are contingent and only discoverable empirically, at least some explanatory connections between conscious states and other mental states are metaphysically necessary and discoverable a priori. (He calls them "intelligible" but on p. 2 says that by "intelligible" facts he just means ones that can be known a priori.)

Langsam helpfully compares his view with a priori functionalism about conscious experience (83-85). On a priori functionalism, the property of having an experience of a round thing is a priori reducible to a kind of dispositional-functional property: having a state that is disposed to be caused by round things, that is disposed to cause the external world belief that a round thing is present, and perhaps also the introspective belief that one is having a certain kind of experience, and so on. Likewise, the property of having a severe pain in the foot is having a state that, inter alia, is disposed to cause the desire that it stop. So, there are a priori, necessary connections between conscious states and dispositions to have certain beliefs and desires.

Langsam considers this an important insight (3, 73, 84). The big differences is that, unlike a priori functionalists (and proponents of "cognitive accessibility" theories of consciousness), he does not think that the necessary connections obtain because conscious states are reducible to complex dispositional-functional states concerning what beliefs and desires subjects are poised to form (among other things). Rather, as I have explained, he endorses anti-reductionism: conscious states are non-physical, categorical states that are distinct from and explain the associated mental dispositions. So he holds that the relevant a priori knowable, metaphysically necessary connections between conscious experiences and mental dispositions (or "powers") are substantive, necessary connections between distinct states, undermining the Humean view that causal connections are always contingent and a posteriori.

Langsam only roughly formulates a few such a priori "psychological necessities". For instance, he claims (75-76; 161-2) that it is metaphysically (not just nomologically) necessary that, if an individual has severe pain, then this causes the individual to have at least the disposition to desire that it stop (though sometimes the disposition is never manifested, because of countervailing mental states). (Here Langsam might have addressed those with "pain asymbolia", who seem not to be bothered by pain at all.) Likewise, according to Langsam, it is metaphysically necessary that, if an individual with the general capacity for belief has a vivid conscious experience as of a round thing out there in the external world (for a sufficient period of time), then this causes the individual to have at least the disposition to form the external-world belief that a round thing is present (93-94), and the disposition to form the introspective belief that he has an experience as of a round thing (107). (See also Langsam 2002, p. 5.)

So, the idea is that conscious experiences are constitutively connected with various mental dispositions or capacities, even if they cannot be analyzed in terms of such dispositions. I find this quite plausible. As Langsam notes (198), others who have defended this general idea include John Hawthorne, Timothy Sprigge, and Brian O'Shaughnessy. And many have defended the more specific claim that conscious perception is constitutively connected with the inclination to believe, even if it cannot be reduced to belief (e.g., A. D. Smith, Alex Byrne). Such psychological necessities are difficult to make precise while avoiding counterexamples and vacuity. But granting they are right, Langsam might have addressed a natural question: why do these psychological necessities obtain? Why do severe pains necessarily endow us with the distinct disposition to desire that they stop? And why do conscious experiences, if they are not reducible to dispositions to believe things, necessarily give us such dispositions?

Even if innumerable such claims are knowable a priori and somehow "intelligible", we can ask whether they have some deeper explanation, or whether each and every one is just a metaphysically basic modal fact, in the sense that it cannot be derived from more basic truths. (Langsam might somehow derive some psychological necessities from other, more basic ones, but then the question would still arise: why do even the "more basic" ones hold?) Previously, I noted that Langsam's anti-reductionism requires basic modal connections between the physical-functional properties of an individual and his conscious experiences that cry out for explanation. Now it appears that he accepts an additional slew of basic modal connections between conscious experiences and certain mental dispositions.

One appealing option available to Langsam would be to say that his psychological necessities are not basic, but rather can be explained by two more basic claims. The first claim is one Langsam himself accepts: there are necessary connections between having conscious experiences and having reasons. For instance, maybe it is a basic necessary normative truth that, when you have an intense pain, you have a very strong (pro tanto) reason to desire that it stop (161). Likewise, necessarily, when you have a conscious experience as of a round thing, you have a very strong reason to believe that there is a round thing there and that you are having an experience as of such a thing (114-115; 120-121). Now, Langsam doesn't discuss the matter, but if he also accepted the second claim that there is in turn a constitutive connection between rationality and beliefs/desires (Donald Davidson, Daniel Dennett, David Lewis), then he might explain his psychological necessities. For instance, on one theory (Lewis 1994), an individual has the belief/desire state S just in case the "best overall interpretation" assigns S to the individual, where the "best overall interpretation" is the one that makes the individual conform closest to (depart least from) the basic principles of theoretical and practical rationality, given his history of conscious experiences and his behavioral dispositions. If having certain experiences (visual experiences, pains, etc.) necessitates having strong reasons for having certain beliefs and desires (the first claim), and if in addition your beliefs and desires are by their nature controlled by rationality considerations (the second claim), then this might provide a general explanation of why those experiences necessitate at least the dispositions to acquire the corresponding beliefs and desires, as Langsam thinks.

Interestingly, Langsam doesn't take this approach. Indeed, his own approach is best understood by contrasting it with this one, for in effect he proposes to reverse this order of explanation. Instead of explaining his psychological necessities in terms of more basic facts about rationality, he takes them to be basic (at least, he doesn't explicitly provide any deeper explanations of them) and appeals to them in his account of rationality. To this I now turn.

Langsam's consciousness-based epistemology

Langsam advocates (in chapter 4) a foundationalist epistemology on which conscious experiences are the only possible source of non-inferentially justified beliefs (114, 131). (Langsam also develops an interesting epistemology of desire and value in chapter 5.) So, on his view, an individual lacking conscious states but otherwise resembling you as much as possible (a zombie or unconscious robot) cannot have any genuinely justified beliefs, even if it has non-conscious surrogates in its sensory modules that cause it to have external-world beliefs (or quasi-beliefs) that are reliably accurate and lead to appropriate behavior.

Langsam supports his consciousness-based foundationalism with a unique principle that tells us when mental states rationalize beliefs. This principle appeals to his basic psychological necessities that I have already discussed. Roughly, the principle states that if (and only if) it is a priori (intelligible) that a state of an individual necessitates that the individual has the disposition to believe that p, then that state is poised to rationalize the belief that p (114; 75-76). (If the individual actually forms the belief that p, then the belief is rational if it is a manifestation of this disposition (134-135).) Call this the necessity-rationality principle. Langsam asserts that only conscious states satisfy his "a priori necessitation" condition: only they can be known a priori to necessarily ground such belief-dispositions (114). For example, as I have noted, Langsam thinks that the conscious experience of a round thing can be known a priori to necessarily ground certain belief-dispositions. So, by his necessity-rationality principle, only such conscious states can rationalize beliefs, in accordance with his consciousness-based foundationalism.

I am sympathetic to consciousness-based foundationalism, but I have questions about Langsam's version. Since Langsam holds that merely having experiences provides immediate justification for certain basic external-world beliefs (128), he counts as defending a "dogmatist" theory of perceptual justification (James Pryor, Michael Huemer, John Pollock). This is how he answers skepticism (120). But Langsam does not address well-known problems with this answer, for instance, its apparent incompatibility with Bayesian updating, the bootstrapping problem, and so on. There are other difficult questions. When we have a visual experience of a complex scene containing a number of things, exactly what propositions about those things do we have immediate justification for believing, and why? That is, what is the scope of immediate perceptual justification? It also seems natural to think we have "more" immediate justification for certain simple perceptual beliefs (e.g., that is roughly red) than we have for more complex or less obvious ones (e.g., about barely-noticeable color differences). If so, how might Langsam explain this within his consciousness-based foundationalism? Might he say that immediate perceptual justification admits of degree, because experiential presentation (the basis of perceptual justification) itself somehow admits of degree?

Turning now to a priori justification, Langsam appeals (104) to conscious intuitions, that is, intellectual experiences, about the "necessary relations that hold between abstract objects" (104-105). So he treats immediate a priori justification as importantly analogous to immediate perceptual justification. But he doesn't address problems and disanalogies. Consider two facts about perception. (i) In the case of perception, global and gross unreliability is metaphysically possible: think of the recently envatted brain in the vat. (ii) In the case of perception, we have a good (causal) explanation of why this situation does not obtain and why we are actually reliable: we are in fact appropriately causally linked to our environment. But the case of "intuition" would seem to be importantly different on both counts. (I) Here gross and global unreliability seems metaphysically impossible. For instance, intuitively, it is metaphysically impossible that there be a thinker whose "intellectual perceptions" and beliefs about (say) numbers globally and grossly fail to match the arithmetical facts; in this case, by contrast to the perceptual case, mere understanding somehow rules out global and gross error (even if it allows for some degree of error and disagreement). (II) In the case of such intuitions about numbers and other abstract objects, it is hard to explain why this situation cannot obtain, and why we are actually extremely reliable. Evidently, unlike in the case of ordinary perception, a causal explanation of our reliability cannot work here, for the simple reason that we are not causally connected with such abstract objects (the "Benacerraf-Field problem"). Moreover, a mere causal explanation is in any case just the wrong kind of explanation, because it could not explain why global and gross unreliability is metaphysically impossible (why couldn't a thinker be deviantly connected with the arithmetical facts?). So Langsam's intuition-based account faces a challenge that is unique to the a priori domain: how might he explain why our a priori intuitions about "relations that hold between abstract objects" are necessarily more or less reliable in basic cases, given that no causal explanation is possible.

Finally, there are apparent counterexamples to Langsam's necessity-rationality principle. For instance, if I am aware that all emeralds I have observed so far have been green, it is not obvious that my evidence is so compelling that it a priori (intelligibly) necessitates my having the disposition to form the outright belief that all emeralds are green; nevertheless forming the belief might be a perfectly rational response to my evidence (Langsam seems aware of the problem at p. 119 but doesn't solve it). Here is another apparent counterexample. Suppose I am aware of some evidence and rationally conclude that p. It might nevertheless be the case that my forming the belief is not an exercise of a disposition to believe that p that is a priori necessitated by merely being aware of that evidence. For there might be others who are aware of the very same evidence but who are not at all disposed to conclude p, because they are irrational (think of the various fallacies to which we are prone).

I hope it will be obvious by now that Langsam's book is a refreshing and commendable addition to recent work on consciousness. It contains many novel and interesting ideas, which Langsam presents in a crisp and engaging way.


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