The World of Freedom: Heidegger, Foucault, and the Politics of Historical Ontology

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Robert Nichols, The World of Freedom: Heidegger, Foucault, and the Politics of Historical Ontology, Stanford University Press, 2014, 277pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804792646.

Reviewed by Alan D. Schrift, Grinnell College


Robert Nichols's basic idea is an interesting one: viewing Foucault's "care of the self" as a successful historicizing of Heidegger's existential analytic of care (Sorge) offers us a powerful alternative to the "prevailing (Kantian) tradition['s problematic] model of freedom as autonomous rational willing" (9). Along the way he provides clear and thoughtful reconstructions of Heidegger's and Foucault's attempts to develop a situational account of freedom, while engaging some other, in Nichols's view, less successful attempts by Herbert Marcuse and Axel Honneth to develop Heideggerian alternatives to the prevailing Kantian tradition.

The book unfolds in seven chapters. In the first, Nichols provides an "Overview of the Problematic" that his text aims to unravel. This chapter offers a clear account of what Nichols seeks to accomplish and also makes clear many of the assumptions that will guide his analyses. The problematic itself is straightforward: an alternative is needed to the two dominant accounts of freedom, namely the view of freedom as a property (autonomy) of the self-constituting transcendental subject and the view, which Nichols calls "teleological freedom," that assumes some purposiveness in history that works through the universal structures of consciousness toward some end (understood differently by Hegel, Marx, and Habermas). Nichols's thesis is that this alternative -- which, following Charles Taylor, he calls "situated freedom" -- is to be found by bringing together features of Heidegger's existential ontology with Foucault's historical ontology. Together, these two ontologies will accommodate an account of finitude that understands freedom as a practice of ethical transformation of one's mode of being rather than as the property of a self-constituting subject.

Chapters two and three are devoted to Heidegger. In chapter two, Nichols provides an exceptionally clear account of Heidegger's project of fundamental ontology in Being and Time as motivated in large part by his desire to respond to the philosophy of the constituting epistemological subject found in Descartes, Kant, and Husserl. By viewing fundamental ontology as a repudiation of traditional approaches to epistemology and metaphysics, Nichols argues that Heidegger's situating the subject as a being-in-the-world turns the acquisition of knowledge into an attempt at self-transformation. Chapter three further develops the ethical implications regarding self-transformation in terms of freedom and historicity. Nichols here argues that "After Being and Time, Heidegger shifted his focus away from [hermeneutic] questions of intelligibility and meaning toward [more practical] questions of truth and freedom" (61). Although Nichols continues to link his discussion of Heidegger back to Division Two of Being and Time, the claim here is that after Being and Time, "the ontological characterization of freedom . . . is expressed as indeterminacy, contingency, and nonclosure in the historical presencing of a lifeworld" (16). Freedom, now understood as "epistemological indeterminacy," manifests itself in world-disclosure as the outcome of human practical activity, and as such, freedom is ontologically tied to truth as that unconcealment revealed through this world-disclosure.

Chapter three concludes by arguing that Heidegger himself was unable to make the move from fundamental to historical ontology, which is to say that his analyses ultimately remain at the level of an abstract ontology that cannot fully accommodate the concrete ontic practices that must be attended to if we are to understand historical change. Nichols makes this argument by turning to the early work of Herbert Marcuse, reading Marcuse's essays of 1928­­-33 as his attempt to construct a bridge between Heidegger's ontological-phenomenological analysis and the material-historical project of Marxism. Marcuse's goal in this project was to show "under what conditions [the Heideggerian notion of historicity] could have concrete factical content while, at the same time, avoiding a certain 'ontic reductionism'" (93). Marcuse's abandoning this project is not, for Nichols, an indication of its impossibility, however; instead it shows the need to find intellectual resources outside those found in either Heidegger or Marx. We find the necessary resources, Nichols argues, in the work of Michel Foucault.

The fourth chapter is admittedly something of an interlude, as Nichols examines Foucault's explicit and implicit critique of Heidegger in his work prior to 1979. This is perhaps the weakest chapter in the book, both in terms of some of what Nichols claims in trying to make the case that Foucault is in fact both influenced by and critically responding to Heidegger in his earliest works and in terms of the fact that this chapter is not really necessary for Nichols's overall project of arguing that Foucault's late work succeeds in historicizing Heidegger's ontological account of freedom. By the end of the chapter, Nichols himself seems to wonder whether it is really Heidegger who is being obliquely referenced when Foucault criticizes the phenomenology of experience or whether it is really Heidegger's hermeneutics -- as put forward in sections 30-34 of Being and Time -- that is being referenced in Foucault's critique of commentary. To be sure, Heidegger's thought is being addressed in Foucault's early essay on Ludwig Binswanger and in the final chapters of The Order of Things. But much of this chapter strains to support Foucault's comment in his last interview that "Heidegger has always been for me the essential philosopher" (24). (Those who cite this interview in support of the influence of Heidegger on Foucault fail to note that while Foucault also claims that "my entire philosophical development was determined by my reading of Heidegger," he follows this by saying "I nevertheless recognize that Nietzsche prevailed over him. I don't know Heidegger well enough: I practically don't know Being and Time nor the things recently published.")

Chapter five addresses the transformations in Foucault's thinking that take place in roughly the years 1977-82, that is, the years when Foucault transformed the project that was to be The History of Sexuality as his thought turned toward ethics and the care of the self. Nichols's strategy in this chapter is quite creative: he looks at the transformations in Foucault's use of three key terms during this period: conduct, thought, and experience. From Discipline and Punish through to the second and third volumes of The History of Sexuality, Nichols claims that we see Foucault's analytic framework moving from understood in terms of the model of war to ideas at play in terms of the model of the game. We see this most clearly as the language of discipline gives way to the language of conduct: in discipline, the goal is to govern behavior in the narrow sense -- disciplinary society wants to enforce certain norms through the exercise of power on the body of the governed. With the language of conduct, on the other hand, Nichols claims that Foucault blurs the line between the activities of the governors and those of the governed, since the practices of governance "act upon the conduct of the governed, a conduct which is always in part about how the governed conduct themselves within such activities, these two sides of the field of power here described are interrelated but not reducible to each other" (138). And by focusing conduct on the relationship rather than the act, the space is opened for the possibility of freedom. Nichols claims that it is this possibility that leads to Foucault's "analysis of ethical-spiritual practices as the ground of an ontological analysis of freedom" (160), which is the focus of the sixth chapter.

In this chapter -- "The Subject of Spirituality" -- Nichols develops what he sees as the "ontological commitments" of Foucault's analysis of spirituality and the care of the self, paying particular attention to Foucault's 1982-83 Collège de France lectures The Hermeneutics of the Subject. Of central importance to Nichols is the distinction Foucault draws between the subject and the self: where the former is grounded in consciousness, the latter is grounded in worldly practices. Foucault follows Heidegger in problematizing the conscious subject and ontologically situating the self in terms of a being-in-the-world engaged in historically contextualized practices, in particular, in historically specific practices of care. And by understanding these practices of care as acts of spiritual transformation, Foucault can provide a historically situated ontological ground for the practices of freedom.

In the seventh and final chapter, Nichols looks to apply the historical ontology of freedom developed from Heidegger and Foucault by showing how it allows us to recast contemporary critical theories of reification. Following an examination of the theories of reification in Lukács and Honneth, Nichols concludes by suggesting that although Foucault rarely uses the language of either reification or objectification, his account of assujettissement or subjectivation, when understood in terms of freedom as a practice of care of the self, allows for the transformative construction of one's self without falling victim to the pernicious effects of reification.

There is much to learn from Nichols's account of Foucault's historical ontology and how it leads us to a more politically helpful understanding of freedom. Similarly, many will be interested in how Nichols reads Foucault along with Heidegger, showing how each helps us to understand the other. But some may find Nichols making more of some of his observations than is warranted. For example, Nichols makes much of the fact that both Heidegger and Foucault develop their accounts of the subject in response to both the Cartesian and Kantian accounts of the subject. This is certainly true, but it isn't particularly distinctive of the connection between Foucault and Heidegger. In fact, which post-Kantian philosophers who have addressed the question of the subject haven't done so in response to Descartes and Kant? Hegel? Nietzsche? Husserl? Derrida? They all are responding to the account of the subject that emerges out of Descartes and Kant. It was Foucault himself who effectively argued in The Order of Things that the very concept "man" is the product of an evolution of thinking on the subject that begins with Descartes's cogito and ends with Kant's anthropology, so it is not surprising that both Heidegger and Foucault, as well as almost everyone else in post-Kantian philosophy, frames their account of the subject in response to the Cartesian and Kantian traditions.

Two omissions in Nichols's text also deflate some of the significance of the connections and comparisons he seeks to make between Heidegger and Foucault. The first is the absence of Gilles Deleuze, who is never mentioned. This is particularly significant in that Nichols seeks to make Heidegger and his Nietzsche lectures, along with Pierre Klossowski's writings on Nietzsche, a central influence in Foucault's own appropriation and use of Nietzsche. As already mentioned, Nichols makes more of Foucault's references to Heidegger as "the essential philosopher" in his last interview than might be warranted. Elsewhere, Foucault comments that he first read Nietzsche in 1953, having been led to him by his reading of Georges Bataille, and as he would remark later, "curious as it may seem," he read Nietzsche "from the perspective of an inquiry into the history of knowledge, the history of reason" (Foucault, "Structuralisme et poststructuralisme," 437). And more importantly, there is little question that the major influence on Foucault's interpretation of Nietzsche and his focus on Nietzschean genealogy was the appearance of Gilles Deleuze's Nietzsche et la philosophie in 1962. Deleuze's absence from Nichols's text is therefore quite surprising.

Equally surprising, and more pertinent to Nichols's focus on the question of freedom, is the absence of any significant discussion of Sartre's account of freedom. Central to Nichols's approach is the position that he calls "situated freedom." While it has been fashionable for several decades to ignore Sartre's work, it seems a significant oversight in Nichols's text to fail to engage fully Sartre's account of freedom, which while conjoined with his account of consciousness, nevertheless is emphatic about the fact that freedom always and only exists in a situation. Avoiding the caricature of Sartre's account of freedom in Being and Nothingness and understanding freedom as always engaged with historically contextualized facticity, one might argue that the account of situated freedom that Nichols finds in Foucault was already there in Sartre. And if the centrality of consciousness in Being and Nothingness creates problems for Nichols's claim that situated freedom emerges as a challenge to the Cartesian-Kantian understanding of the subject, a sympathetic reading of Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason shows clearly that Sartre himself was able to move beyond his early focus on consciousness/subjectivity as he came to discuss freedom as praxis, that is, as the practical activities of a historically situated agent. I bring Sartre in here not to suggest that one should opt for Sartre's account over Foucault's, but rather to suggest that comparing Foucault's account with Marcuse's or Honneth's without addressing in any detail Sartre's account is an oversight that leaves Nichols's comments on what Foucault brings to Heidegger much less momentous than the author appears to think.


Michel Foucault, "Structuralisme et poststructuralisme," in Dits et écrits 1954-1988, T. IV: 1980-1988 (Paris: Gallimard, 1994): 431-457.