The World on Edge

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Edward S. Casey, The World on Edge, Indiana University Press, 2017, 385pp., $42.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253026095.

Reviewed by Fred Evans, Duquesne University


Ed Casey started his publishing career with books on imagining and remembering, followed by a number of others on the encompassing notion of place and its relation to art, landscape, and maps. He then produced three more works that appeared to take us to the periphery of these earlier concerns: one on the glance, another (with Mary Watkins) on the border between the U.S. and Mexico, and now this new one concerning edges. It is not just a pun to say that he presented ourselves and the world to us, and now has brought us to the edge of these endeavors.

Casey's task in this book is twofold. The first task might be thought to cohere with the way we usually think of edges: they are merely the result of and secondary to the things, places, and events that give rise to them. If that were all Casey was doing with edges, his book would still be necessary for a more complete understanding of the shape of reality. We will see that he reveals edges to be far more salient, variant, and forceful than we could have imagined. But he also seems to have a second purpose: to reverse our common ontology and show that it is edges that drive the world, that is, the things, places, and events that we think edges serve only to delimit. All worlds become "edge-worlds" (xx). This reversal also carries with it striking political and ethical consequences for the times in which we now find ourselves.

I will begin with his first, descriptive task, then the second, seemingly ontological one, and end with a criticism meant to spur Casey to further elaboration on his novel and extraordinarily rich idea of edges. Casey describes his initial purpose as a "peri-phenomenology," that is, "the description of ostensibly peripheral phenomena" (xix, 316). This form of phenomenological description requires an attentiveness to peripheries, to what a glance would be more likely to detect than perceptions guided by routine (53-54). Indeed, Casey sees peri-phenomenology as defiantly opposed to reducing phenomena to the sort that allow descriptive exactitude. We must instead allow the phenomena to dictate the type of descriptions that are most suitable to them. In other words, Casey follows the path of Maurice Merleau-Ponty, James Dewey, William James, and other phenomenologist who hold that ambiguous or vague presences are "positive phenomena," realities in their own right, and not the products of inaccurate perceptions (314-15). The phenomena upon which Casey concentrates can therefore "be brought into words that are neither too precise nor too vague but that are true to the edges themselves" (316). Despite this affinity with phenomenologists such as Sartre, Merleau-Ponty, and Heidegger, Casey does not share their preoccupation with pre-reflective experience or the dizzying heights of Being. His concern is with "any kind or level of experience, implicit or explicit, in which edges are operative, including those that belong to transhuman realms, as in wilderness or the sky" (300).

Casey considers his peri-phenomenology as akin to James's "radical empiricism" (301). Others might worry that it is more like a "phenomenological positivism," a mere catalogue of the different kinds of edges we experience. But even in terms of his first purpose, that of phenomenologically describing edges, Casey is far beyond the superficiality suggested by such a positivism. He reveals the importance and prominence of edges with such verve that the world becomes for us an "edge-world" (4). To help bring about this transformation, Casey divides his book into four parts. Part I provides a taxonomy of edge types, Part II concerns the contrast between constructed and naturally given edges, for example, parks and the wild, and Part III examines the edges of body and psyche, earth and sky. The fourth part consists of a "last lesson," followed by a "postlude," then an "epilogue," that is, the sequential edges of Casey's further thoughts on these matters, each of them adding philosophical depth to the previous ones.

Casey's first part captures the fundamental idea of edges. One of his most salient statements on this topic is that "every edge and every perception of an edge is on the way to elsewhere, on the verge of going somewhere else." This transitional quality of edges explains why we tend to note only their other role of "establishing the extent or spread" of a thing, place, or event. Indeed, we typically wish to evade the transitivity of edges because it conveys the "characteristic anxiety of the uncertain and the precarious" (xviii). Later, Casey provides us with a name for what his peri-phenomenology has discovered -- that edges possess a "material intentionality," that they "unmindingly intend" what is beyond them, and that, through what Casey calls "apperceptive transfer," they also "vanish" or self-eclipse, canceling their delimiting role and orienting our perceptions to something other than themselves (326-28).

Casey expands upon "this logic of the less" in his "postlude" (319-40). But the previous comments on the material intentionality and apperceptive transfer of edges will suffice for capturing the main thrust of this logic. Casey interrogates an array of edge types in Part I: borders, boundaries, folds, creases, margins, verges, rims, thresholds, frames, gaps, cusps, traces, and veils. He also distinguishes between active and passive edges, contrasts edges with limits, and describes the relation of edges to surfaces, things, places, and events. In short, his treatment of edges is exhaustive, but not exhausting. Casey has a rare ability: he combines limpid prose and his command of thought and culture to make each of his descriptions carry their own forward movement. For example, his elucidation of traces -- marked or cut into a surface -- involves a discussion of Jacques Derrida's well-known idea of différance and concludes that a trace is both the physical effect of tracing (also the psychical effect of traumatic memories or "psychological scars") and "the sign of the tracing's having happened, having become" (63). The effect of these descriptions of edges is to increase our appreciation of this fruitful combination of evocative writing and cultural erudition. A plethora of important thinkers, artists, art works, and other cultural agencies show up in these descriptions, always helping to illustrate the edge in question.

In Part I Casey also identifies limits with "borders" and edges with "boundaries." This allows him to clarify and valorize certain social and political aspects of his understanding of edges. Borders are "clearly demarcated edges" and differentiate, "delimit" and close off, regions, states, territories, and other places from one another; in contrast, a bioregion such as a desert, or a neighborhood such as the lower East Side of Manhattan, constitute boundaries that are "inherently indeterminate, porous, and often change configuration" (7, 47). Moreover, the two types of edges frequently overlap. To use my own example, the French colonialization of Laos during the late 1800s transformed the natural boundary of the Mekong River into a border with Thailand. The colonizers thought they could use the Mekong as a passage into China for trading purpose. This proved impossible for navigational reasons and the colony became unprofitable for the French. But depending on which side of the river they lived, the Lao became citizens of either Laos or Thailand. The border formally divided them, but its natural porosity also allowed the Lao on either side to continue interacting with one another. In this vein, Casey points out that protest art converted the pure border of the Berlin Wall into one with boundary-like qualities. The book which Casey recently wrote with Mary Watkins, Up Against the Wall: Reimagining the U.S. Mexico Border, constitutes one of the most complete and timely examples of protest art's role in making a border -- la Frontera in this case -- even more of the porous boundary it seeks to become again (see 92-93, 118-19 and elsewhere in The World on Edge). Besides suggesting the political world we might hope for, Casey adopts Deleuze and Guattari's notion of "reciprocal presupposition" to formulate a rule: "no edges without a limit that superintends them; no limit without edges that complicate it and populate its otherwise empty ideal space" (52; Casey's italics).

In Part II, Casey investigates artificial (human made) and natural edges (120-21). One of the most interesting aspects of this exploration is a delineation of four models for conceptualizing the interaction between the artefactual and the natural: dialectical, dovetailing, intertanglement, and interfusion. Of the four, Casey thinks that the interfusion model best captures what is salient about the interaction between the artefactual and the natural: it preserves the sense in which the two types of edges are distinguishable but inseparable from one another. Moreover, he uses Hans-Georg Gadamer's idea of the "fusion of horizons" to capture this interfusion and the Hudson River to illustrate it: "every moment in [the Hudson River's] history, it has been a dynamic commixture of its natural and artefactual parameters, each coexisting with the other in a state of deep imbrication: the river interfusing with all that has occurred on and in it since human beings began to interact with it." He elaborates that the artefactual edges in this case are the settlements alongside the river and the many other particular cultural and historical factors the Hudson has borne; its natural edges consist of the movement of tides, fish populations, changing seasons, and the other ingredients that have been part of it before and during its fusion with the artefactual edges (127). In contrast to this interfusion, wildness (as opposed to wilderness) "is whatever the nonhuman environment delivers on its own, unassisted by human influence or interaction" (138). As pure becomings, wild edges are found everywhere, in and outside of areas of human habitation, even in Jackson Pollack's paintings ("paradigmatic of the natural world in its heterogeneous becoming"), James Joyce's and Deleuze and Guattari's idea of "chaosmos" (155-56), and music such as Sila: The Breath of the World (165-66).

In Part III, Casey's treatment of the edges of body and psyche, earth and sky, take us in a number of directions that I can only partially enumerate here. The diverse edges of the body -- the size, shape, projection (including auras, gestures, and signs), and other forms of the outermost of our body parts -- are the "thresholds" through which we gain access to our environment and to others (212-14, 229). Moreover, these edges "dissolve" in the actions that they help to bring about, including touching oneself and others (220). Casey borrows liberally from Husserl, Merleau-Ponty, and other phenomenolgists in his discussion of these corporeal edges. His statement that they mediate between the earth and the psyche involves speaking of the unconscious and other psychoanalytic aspects of the body/psyche as well as the dynamics of "being on edge" and "falling apart," on the one hand. On the other, it includes how the earth presents itself to us, that is, as a horizon, perceptually "a fading region in which the earth meets the sky: a place of conjuncture that is more of a bleeding boundary than a strict border" (268). Casey's descriptions of body, psyche, and earth edges are much more complex than I have indicated here. But the examples I have given for Part III, and also for Parts I and II, should indicate the comprehensiveness and fruitfulness of Casey's peri-phenomenology.

At one place Casey denies he is constructing an ontology: "I stop short of anything like an ontological enterprise and stay within the compass of what can be described as such" (301). But in others he argues that "in their continual upsurge, edges reinsert themselves as primary" (156,130). More fully:

My premise throughout this book has been that the edges of things and places and events, and of much else besides, far from being secondary and external, are primary: they are the formative features of that of which they are the edges. Far from edges being only the final stage of something, they are also where that something begins . . . Our animal existence precedes from edge to edge in the interworld of intercalated edges, those of our sensing bodies and those of our sensed environs as intermeshed in a living matrix. Much the same is true of our existence as thinking creatures. (357-58; see also 4, 81, 130, 333-34, 337)

This primacy of edges suggests the ontological reversal I mentioned at the beginning of this review. I think it is plausible to say that Casey's ontology is actually the primacy of the "event-world" -- the processual world of Whitehead, Deleuze and Guattari, and, more strictly phenomenologically, Merleau-Ponty. One of Casey's original contributions to this event-world would then be his discovery and elucidation of its infrastructure of edges. It also serves one of the social-political aims of his book: to allow us to think more effectively and innovatively about global warming, nuclear destruction, neoliberalism, and the other "diastremes in which we, along with the earth itself, are now caught up" (367). My question is, would Casey accept this ontological aspect as the undergirding or result of his otherwise peri-phenomenological endeavor?

A second critical point concerns the status of the edge-world with respect to realism and idealism. Casey's allegiance to phenomenology might suggest that edges are part of our perceptual world, that is, dependent on the subjective and constituting activity of sentient beings. But Casey sometimes suggests that edges exist independently of our perceiving them as edges. For example, "in view of their unrefusable reality, it would be a mistake to imagine that edges depend for their existence on our interaction with them. We must not be tempted by subjective idealism in their case . . ." (19). We know that without sentient beings the foreground-background structure of reality disappears -- its presence requires perceivers of some sort. Is it the same for the distinction between edges and things? Perhaps we cannot answer this conclusively, but it is true that reality often invites us to see it in unorthodox ways and frequently interrupts our more steadfast ways of posing it to ourselves in discourse and thought. We cannot describe these edges and things apart from our way of encountering them. But perhaps Casey means it is enough to know that reality forces us to recognize it as something always on the "verge of going somewhere else," always a "material intentionality," to repeat what I quoted earlier.

The first two critical points above -- ontology/no ontology, realism/idealism -- request only that Casey be more explicit on his stance with respect to them. The third is more tenacious. In his discussion of how to respond to the diastremes, Casey advocates that we must "think through what it means to think on [them]," that is, "reflective thinking" or its equivalent, "philosophical thinking" (356, 362). Casey provides an extended deliberation on the meaning of this form of thinking and the many edges that constitute its own "topography" (357). He criticizes Heidegger and Deleuze for valorizing only a leap beyond the sedentary and urges us, instead, to "stay on the edge, perched there uneasily, indefinitely suspended and without any prospect of egress from that edge" (359). One stays on this edge, however, by creating new edges with respect to the topic (361-62), and thinking them through (361). To further elucidate this thinking, Casey adopts some ideas and techniques of the thirteenth-century Zen master, Dogen, and his emphasis upon reflectively thinking within an indeterminate "nonplace." The details are scintillating, but it sometimes sounds much like the model of the isolated thinker. It leads me to ask why Casey overlooks another mode that I know he values as well: the social mode of agonistic dialogue with others. In this democratic mode, hearing the thoughts of others spurs new ideas into existence; the interplay among such voices can even give rise serendipitously to new voices, to new edges and edge-worlds. This is especially the case when, as Casey declares, the world is "on edge," threatened by a resurgence of political demons we hoped would have stayed in the graves history had already made for them. This agonistic democracy would therefore seem to deserve a place in his model of reflective thinking.

To his magisterial investigation of the edge-world, then, I would ask Casey to think on these few critical comments while he experiments with the new thoughts I know he is preparing for us.