The World-Time Parallel: Tense and Modality in Logic and Metaphysics

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A.A. Rini and M.J. Cresswell, The World-Time Parallel: Tense and Modality in Logic and Metaphysics, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 278pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107017474.

Reviewed by David Ripley, University of Connecticut


The World-Time Parallel is, as it says in the subtitle, a work of both logic and metaphysics. Its main aim is to demonstrate, by consideration of a number of examples, that there are strong structural similarities between debates in the metaphysics of modality and debates in the metaphysics of time. I'll start by outlining the structure of the book, and then offer a bit of discussion.

After an introduction, the book is divided into four parts, each of which contains four or five chapters, plus five appendices. Part I, 'Truth and indexicality', presents the basics of Rini and Cresswell's approach to thinking about worlds and times, providing an introduction to the themes of the book. The first chapter introduces tense and modal operators and the notions of truth-at-a-time and truth-at-a-world. The second chapter extends this to truth-at-a-person, to handle indexicals like 'I'. In the third chapter, the book presents phenomena like essential indexicality and de se belief. The fourth chapter discusses 'privileged positions', considering arguments for and against taking the present to be a special time or taking the actual world to be a special world, as well as considering just what this specialness might amount to. In line with their stated strategy, Rini and Cresswell do not take a stand on whether one should take the present or the actual world to be privileged, but merely argue that they should be treated the same as each other.

Part II, 'Predicate logic: tense and modal', is an introduction to some of the formal tools the authors deploy in the remainder of the book. It is written for those with little to no logical expertise, starting from the very beginning and covering a particular sort of quantified modal and tense logic. (For those interested the logic includes: constant domain, linear times, bimodal (one universal modal operator and one Kish operator), plus a counterfactual arrow and a knowledge operator, plus indexed operators for both times and worlds, handled slightly nonstandardly.) Despite starting from absolute basics, and including everything you'd need, it is compressed enough that readers without logical experience will want more guidance than is provided. Such readers might also simply choose to skip this part entirely and return to bits of it as necessary, although I wouldn't recommend that.

The fifth chapter presents most of a formal language, along with models and truth conditions. The sixth chapter is a discussion of nonexistence, considering how to formalize claims about what did exist but does not, or what might exist but does not, defending the choice of a constant-domain model theory. The seventh chapter extends the formal language to deal with 'now', 'then', 'actually', and the like via indexed operators of various sorts. The eighth chapter considers the same range of data, and gives a translation argument to the effect that the needed extension to indexed operations brings with it the full power of quantification over worlds and times.

Part III, 'Times and worlds, or tense and modality?', considers the issues of priority suggested by its title: are indices at which things are true prior, or are temporal and modal truths themselves prior? Here Rini and Cresswell go beyond their stated strategy. They do not merely argue that this question should be handled in the same way for worlds and times, however it is to be handled. They instead argue for a particular answer -- that the question is ill-posed, for both worlds and times -- by adopting a particular metaphysics of both worlds and times, one that is at least reminiscent of various deflationary views.

The ninth chapter lays out this view, making clear that Rini and Cresswell take certain inferential behaviour to be sufficient for quantification. Since modal and temporal sentences exhibit this behaviour, they conclude that such sentences involve quantifiers. Worlds and times, they say, are just whatever modal and temporal operators quantify over. Given the truth of certain modal and temporal claims, "there can be no doubt that [worlds and times] are. The reductive question can only be what they are" (p. 105). (In this quote, Rini and Cresswell are actually talking about pohutukawa trees rather than worlds or times, but the context is one in which pohutukawa trees are being used in an argument by analogy meant to cover worlds and times.) The tenth chapter continues in the same vein, using auxiliary vocabulary from Part II to intertranslate actualist and possibilist quantifiers. The eleventh chapter returns its focus to the parallel between worlds and times, focusing on arguments for presentism and actualism. The twelfth and thirteenth chapters consider some side issues: utterances and special relativity.

Part IV, 'De rerum natura', turns to the treatment of things in various settings. The fourteenth chapter considers whether things can exist at multiple worlds or times, or whether they are world- or time-bound, arguing that the phenomenon of parthood raises difficult issues for the corresponding spatial questions, which is important because these spatial questions are often used in analogies meant to help with the modal and temporal cases.

The fifteenth chapter distinguishes and briefly discusses six views about "continuity conditions for the sort of ordinary objects that we want to talk about", all of which are compatible with (and considered here in the context of) an ontology containing "all mereological sums of 'point-events'" (pp. 166-167). These six views are generated by a two-way distinction orthogonal to a three-way one. The two-way distinction is between four-dimensionalist views, which see objects as extended through time only, and five-dimensionalist views, which see them as extended through times and worlds both. The three-way distinction is between stageism -- the view that predicates apply to (three-dimensional) stages -- and two types of wormism -- the view that predicates apply to (four- or five-dimensional) worms. These distinctions are used to attack an argument due to Quine for treating worlds and times differently.

The sixteenth chapter considers the questions whether nonactual worlds and individuals, as well as nonpresent times and individuals, are abstract or concrete, arguing that the arguments in the area apply equally to worlds and times. The seventeenth chapter considers issues to do with supervenience and causation, two places where we might have expected a disanalogy between worlds and times to reveal itself, and argues that no such disanalogies do reveal themselves.

As to the five appendices: four of them present and prove technical results of various sorts, and the fifth (coauthored with Helga Kocurek) uses the world-time parallel to develop an argument due to Rea against presentism into a new argument against actualism.


The introduction, the sixteen chapters, and the five appendices together occupy only 251 pages; the discussion is quite breezy throughout, and much is left implicit. It can sometimes be difficult to see how what is under discussion relates to the world-time parallel, except by being about worlds or times. In some places, the connection is at best indirect; Rini and Cresswell spend some time on side issues that arise in the course of the exploration. For example, they consider in a few places (pp. 26-29, 71-74) whether we should countenance impossible worlds or impossibilia. (They argue no to both, but their arguments won't convince anyone familiar with the literature on these issues.) Eight pages is not much, but it is more than 3% of the book, and this is a single side issue. In a work of this compressed nature, it might have been better to focus more directly on the main point, and leave the side issues to fend for themselves.

Had they done this, there would have been more room for discussion of an important issue that is left to one side. They do not discuss (except to say (p. 16) that they will not discuss) the question whether time's linear order and metric structure, neither of which seems to have a modal analogue, provide any important disanalogies. But this seems to be an important question for any discussion of purported parallels between worlds and times: it is the most obvious structural difference between them. Issues about time that depend crucially on this structure (such as questions about its flow) do not seem to have modal parallels.

When they stay to their main point, however, they are convincing. Given the informal setup of Part I and the formal setup of Part II, the structural similarities between a number of familiar positions are made apparent. Consider, for example, presentism and actualism: where presentists maintain that the only things that exist are those that exist at this time, actualists maintain that the only things that exist are those that exist at this world. All it takes to transform one position into the other is a swap of times for worlds, or vice versa. The situation is the same for eternalism and possibilism, of course, and for a variety of other well-known positions, as Rini and Cresswell show in the course of Parts III and IV. These examples undeniably make the point that there are strong connections between the metaphysics of time and modality.

But the parallel between worlds and times, as Rini and Cresswell see it, is deeper than this. It does not merely connect the positions adopted in these various debates; it also connects the debates themselves. For example, they say, "What we mean [by 'parallel'] is this. If you are faced with an argument in the philosophy of modality, there ought to be a corresponding argument in the philosophy of time which has the same structure" (p. xiv).

Around here I start to worry. They go on to make clear that the sort of structure they mean here is logical structure. Since logical structure is substitution-invariant, either both of the corresponding arguments are logically valid or neither is. Any failure to draw parallel conclusions, they conclude, must be due to some failure to accept parallel premises. But those premises must be ones "for which no argument is given, since if an argument is given you can apply the same procedure to that argument" (p. xv). The point recurs at the end of the book's main text: "if there is a difference in ontological status [between worlds and times] then it is difficult to see how logical argument could reveal it. If logical argument is unavailable then metaphysics is only position stating" (pp. 197-198).

Rini and Cresswell are not so bold as to make the implausible (to my eyes, anyhow) claim that there can be no reason to have different attitudes towards, say, presentism and actualism; in fact, they explicitly stop shy of it: "We do not in this book claim that there are never reasons to treat temporal and modal arguments differently" (p. xv). But it is difficult for me to see how caveats like this one fit with their stated positions. It looks like they are committed to the implausible claim, given their understanding of what the parallel amounts to. This understanding appears to come in two parts: 1) that logic itself gives us no reason to treat worlds and times differently, so if we end up treating them differently it must be for some nonlogical reason; and 2) that nonlogical reasons are all mere position stating.

The first claim is fair enough, but on its own it is not very important: it is, after all, as true of worlds and cows as it is of worlds and times. There is very little doubt that, by a simple search-and-replace on some recent journal articles, you could rig up a perfectly valid argument that truth is had not absolutely, but only at a pair of a world and a cow. Moreover, you could give a full and precise model theory embodying your conclusion:

Let W be a nonempty set of worlds, and let C be a nonempty set of cows. A sentence A is true at a world/cow pair <w, c>, where w W and c C iff . . .

There might be some trouble in proving completeness in the usual way; depending on what vocabulary is in the language, canonical model constructions may well require more cows than there are. That's a nonlogical worry, and it brings out the problem with the second claim: it is a nonlogical worry that can be reasonably discussed. If you think there are finitely many cows and I think there are uncountably many, we are not immediately reduced to puzzled stares. There can be good reasons for belief beyond deductively valid arguments from blindly accepted premises. But such reasons seem left out in the cold here.

Rini and Cresswell's actual arguments for a world-time parallel are much more convincing than any putative arguments for a world-cow parallel. The world-cow discussion above is not in any way a parody of their reasoning. The problem is that their claims about what their arguments show fail to distinguish their good world-time arguments from some bad world-cow ones. This seems to be because Rini and Cresswell think logic provides more of a foundation to metaphysics than it is plausible to suppose. Their metaphilosophy finds expression in the claim that "philosophy (or at least metaphysics) has to begin with an account of the logical structure of everyday claims" (p. 123). The trouble with this way of thinking is well-known: it seems impossible to give such an account without already appealing to a good bit of philosophy (or at least metaphysics). To point to a few perennially vexing examples, consider whether "Sherlock Holmes lives at 221B Baker Street" entails "Someone lives at 221B Baker Street", whether "2 + 2 = 5" entails "Bryce is the wickedest penguin", or whether "If I'm not eating a donut unless I want to then I'm eating a donut" entails "I'm eating a donut". These and other debates about logical structure turn crucially (although of course not solely) on various metaphysical theses. Debates around free logics, relevant logics, logicist treatments of maths, and constructive logics are hardly innocent of metaphysics.

Closer to the present discussion, consider whether "Dinosaurs exist" entails "Dinosaurs exist now", or whether "Talking donkeys exist" entails "Talking donkeys actually exist". We can't settle these questions while avoiding substantive metaphysics, so that metaphysics can come along later and appeal to the logical facts.

Happily, the book's unfortunate metaphilosophy does not much interfere with the first-order philosophy it contains, which works well, largely independently of how it is viewed. For example, the book begins with an account of the logical structure of everyday claims. This account is far from first philosophy: it is an account, like any other, with plenty of substantive philosophy already baked in. But this is just fine, and in no way undermines its value. There's never been any place to start but in the middle.

This still leaves us, though, with the question what the parallel can amount to. I, for one, remain convinced that there is more to the world-time parallel than there is to the world-cow parallel. Rini and Cresswell do much to support this conclusion, but they don't give a plausible theory of what this can mean; we are left to try to understand the situation on our own. Happily, we are in a better position than we were: their careful and detailed studies of how the parallel can be drawn on in arguments about a range of issues provide helpful raw materials for such an understanding.

Thanks to Sam Baron, Rohan French, and Suzy Killmister for valuable discussions.