The World We Want: How and Why the Ideals of the Enlightenment Still Elude Us

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Robert B. Louden, The World We Want: How and Why the Ideals of the Enlightenment Still Elude Us, Oxford University Press, 2007, 324pp., $ 65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195321371.

Reviewed by Beatrix Himmelmann, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


This book does not join in the chorus of still influential intellectual circles trying to convince us that the Enlightenment project not only failed, but that it was doomed to fail because it was inevitably linked up with an inherent self-destructive dialectic. As Horkheimer and Adorno pointed out in their famous attack, Enlightenment promises of freedom of thought, liberties ruling individual life, progress of knowledge and welfare, the evolution of moral attitudes and therefore the prospect of humanity's triumph changes into something negative and destructive as soon as we attempt to realize these ideals. According to Horkheimer and Adorno, the Enlightenment ends up in violence and becomes "totalitarian" when it ceases to be critical reflection and turns into practical engagement. This line of argumentation has been picked up by many present day critics, among them anti-liberals like MacIntyre, certain disciples of Nietzsche and Foucault as well as adherents of deconstruction.

In contrast to this account, Robert B. Louden holds that the ideals of the Enlightenment are still relevant for us today. He does not share the view so often repeated since the emergence of the idea of Enlightenment in the eighteenth century that these ideals are hopelessly optimistic, naïve and therefore shallow, if not dangerous. Louden refers in this regard to Ernst Cassirer, who finished his classic study The Philosophy of the Enlightenment shortly before he left Germany in 1933. Like Cassirer, Louden emphasizes the practical impetus that inspired the protagonists of Enlightenment. Thought was taken to have the power and the task of shaping life itself. Philosophy was not supposed to be limited to dissecting analysis alone but considered to have practical impact as well. Louden is interested in exactly this question: what has happened to Enlightenment ideals in the course of historical developments that followed their proclamation? Has mankind actually been willing to continue striving for their realization? If so, how and to what extent has this striving been successful? And in case either certain aims of Enlightenment thinkers have been rejected or failure to achieve them has to be admitted, what are the reasons for either the one or the other? Does human nature simply resist at least some of the ambitious ends upheld by the Enlightenment? Should we therefore give them up? Have there been means chosen in order to bring Enlightenment ideals into being that can be proved wrong, so that we might stick to the aims but change the ways of pursuing them?

Louden examines five crucial areas of Enlightenment concern:  religion, education, economics, politics, and international relations.  He explores these fields in the two parts of his book, giving an account of the proposals outlined "then", in the eighteenth century, and evaluating the situation "now", more than two hundred years later.  Louden's investigations clearly show that a global approach to all essential questions concerning the organization of human life, the conviction of universal validity and applicability of values, a strong emphasis on moral obligation, and the idea of human perfectibility shape the Enlightenment's conceptions.

Louden can demonstrate that the universal dimension of Enlightenment projects has been widely accepted, with one interesting exception that will be discussed later. The idea of general access to education (an indispensable means of developing and cultivating humans' intellectual and emotional capabilities,) for instance, has been acknowledged broadly. Moreover, an (almost) universal spreading of at least fundamental education, not at all attained in the eighteenth century, has been achieved -- although notable disparities between rich and poor world regions obviously still exist. Economical contact and cooperation of peoples all over the world have also flourished. Controls on trade have been relaxed and market economies the number of which is still growing have been established. The right to self-governance of nations which was, according to Louden, crucial to Enlightenment reform efforts in the area of politics has been approved and accomplished to a considerable extent as well.

It should be noted that Louden emphasizes the idea of what he calls "Enlightenment nationalism" (211), rather to the disadvantage of Enlightenment's cosmopolitan orientation. "Enlightenment nationalism" is supposed to stand for the vision of "fatherlands" that "lie peacefully besides each other and support each other as families" (quote from Herder; cf. 77). Louden's account refers to authors like Rousseau, Herder, and Fichte who are commonly regarded as figures ushering in the Romantic protest against Enlightenment political thinking, pointing out that man should not artificially join together what nature has separated by language, custom, and character.

Another Enlightenment political ideal, undoubtedly, is republicanism as a form of government. Marked by the separation of legislative, executive, and judicial powers, by competitive elections, and by the rule of law, republicanism is nowadays largely identified with (liberal) democracy. Such republicanism has proved to be quite successful worldwide. While there were only three partial or restricted democracies by the late eighteenth century (the United States, the French Republic, and Switzerland), this form of government has undeniably gained ground since then. Enlightenment proposals concerning the general structure of international relations have been approved, at least in principle even after some serious setbacks. We now do have a global organization, the United Nations, as a federation of 192 countries whose main aim is to establish a peaceful international order. It stipulates that nations cooperate in solving international economic, social, cultural and humanitarian problems and promote respect for human rights and fundamental freedoms.

Remarkably, Enlightenment visions of universally valid structures that should be essential for any truly human life have, according to Louden, clearly failed in only one area: religion. The question of religion is often thought to have found a quick and determinate negative answer on the part of Enlightenment thinkers. They are supposed to have aimed at the elimination of religion, attempting to cure us from what they are said to have seen as a sort of spiritual malady entailing ignorance and lack of freedom. Louden shows persuasively that this picture is misleading. Even Voltaire, whose battle cry against the church Écrasez l'infâme is well known, embraced deism, nevertheless. One main idea about religion advocated by Enlightenment authors is the conviction that all the different historical faiths are manifestations of one universal religion. A classical articulation of this thought can be found in the parable of the rings that Lessing presents in his play Nathan the Wise. And it is morality as the epitome of universal humanity that is held to be the bond that makes different faiths be different materializations of one genuine religion.

Seen in the light of Enlightenment expectations, we are confronted with a religious scenario today that reveals some rather astonishing tendencies. On the one hand, there is an amazing resurgence of religious commitment in general, from the late 1970s onward, that intellectuals (particularly those who perceive themselves as the heirs of the Enlightenment) would not have considered probable. As for instance Habermas, they were inclined to presume that we are definitely living in "post-metaphysical" times. Modernity and religion seemed to exclude each other once Nietzsche had proclaimed the "death of God." On the other hand, we are experiencing the growth of a kind of religion that displays features which seem not at all compatible with Enlightenment ideals. There is a remarkable proneness to religious fundamentalism that focuses on local, on particular, and on dubious nationalistic concerns. Moreover, modern forms of terrorism refer to fundamentalist religious convictions in order to justify what they say is their fight against Western blasphemy.

Here we arrive at Louden's most interesting, though not completely surprising point. What is apparent in regard to religion at a quick glance can be discovered with respect to the other fields of Enlightenment concern by moving beneath the surface of the achieved institutional realization of Enlightenment ideals: the actual core, the heart of the Enlightenment project still seems to be mere vision. Institutions in education, economics, politics, and international relations were supposed to supply only the framework that had to be filled with the life of the Enlightenment spirit -- the rule of reason and law, moral conduct, and the idea of humanity's perfectibility. Accordingly, man was thought to have a vocation which he should and could bring into being out of his own strength. But not even in the area of education, where it should have been most likely to put down roots, is this idea upheld and fostered today.

Louden demonstrates that education at all levels is increasingly valued merely as a Brotstudium (after a formulation by Friedrich Schiller) -- as just a means to make one's living. Enlightenment thinkers had advocated a far more ambitious concept of education. Though they put emphasis on facts being taught instead of opinions (including religious belief), they did not want instruction to be reduced to supplying useful know how. On the contrary, Kant for instance suggested the idea that education should enable students to handle their own freedom, to use their gift of reason critically as well as publicly, and to exercise their powers and capabilities in a morally suitable manner.

Nobody today, not even people tending to gloss things over, would claim that the rule of reason and law, moral conduct, and the idea of humanity's perfectibility govern the world. A review of the twentieth century, in particular, reveals some horrible regressions with respect to these hopes. The foundation of the United Nations after World War II was one answer to this experience. "How and why the ideals of the Enlightenment still elude us", can be studied, paradigmatically, by reflecting on some details of UN reality which Louden lays out (cf. 186-191).

The UN charter defines four broad goals towards which this organization is supposed to work: (1) "to save succeeding generations from the scourge of war, which twice in our lifetime has brought untold sorrow to mankind"; (2) "to reaffirm faith in human rights"; (3) "to establish conditions under which … respect for … international law can be maintained"; and (4) "to promote social progress and better standards of life in larger freedom" (cf. 186). Nearly all of the world's countries are members of the UN today, and therefore are obliged to promote these goals. Nevertheless, we are indubitably far away from having attained them. On the contrary, clear offence against them is the order of the day. We might say this is not astonishing at all, since the demands included in a promotion of these aims only exist on paper. However, in accordance with the Enlightenment's stress on practicability, the UN actually is provided with special organs by means of which the goals spelled out in the charter ought to be advanced.

The most important of these organs is, of course, the Security Council. It is responsible for determining whether "any threat to the peace, breach of the peace, or act of aggression" has occurred, and it is also responsible for deciding what, if any, action is to be taken (cf. 187). The institutional structure of the Security Council, however, is not suitable for representing all member states in their equal rights and duties.  It consists of five permanent members (China, France, Russian Federation, United Kingdom, United States) all of whom possess a veto power in regard to all substantial matters. It is obvious that each of these states is able to stop any resolution and to prevent any action that it considers adverse to its partial interests and advantages. This is, of course, a decisive weakness of the United Nations with respect to the task it must fulfill. At the San Francisco foundation conference in 1945, the institutional structure of the Security Council was settled after "the most dramatic controversy" that "can hardly be characterized as negotiation." In the end, "in order to get it through the Conference, the great powers had to state quite baldly that unless … [the great-power veto] was accepted, there would be no world organization" (187). Amending the veto system, which both reflects an out of date constellation of power and stands for a means that is, to say the least, not perfectly appropriate for pursuing the general goals of the UN, appears to be extremely difficult. Any charter amendment must be adopted and ratified by two thirds of the UN members, including all the permanent members of the Security Council.

This is only one example of how things tend to go, on a large as well as on a small scale. Should we despair, especially in regard to the failure of the Enlightenment's expectations that morality grows stronger -- a failure Louden emphasizes again and again? He quotes Lichtenberg: "We talk a lot about Enlightenment and light. But, my God, what is the use of light if people either have no eyes or intentionally shut those they have?" (203).  Should we therefore become so-called realists, resigning ourselves to the facts that history reveals about human nature, and reduce our aspirations accordingly? Louden has some sympathy for the "history test" (cf. 203-207). Particularly the Enlightenment concept of religion, he argues, seems to have been resisted rather definitely: the deistic fantasy of a universal religion is not about to be brought to fruition. But his main point is Kantian. With respect to most of the Enlightenment goals that we, indeed, still do share, it is both reasonable and indispensable to live and work in hope of their fulfillment. This hope is reasonable unless it could be shown that to achieve the aims we strive for is in fact impossible. This hope is indispensable unless we decide to give up living in a human way, which means having ends and moving under our own direction. And what kind of use, sense or purpose would lie in surrendering to resignation or cynicism? "At the risk of appearing irreparably nostalgic", Louden pleads for reviving the spirit of the Enlightenment, a force in history that occurred in the eighteenth century but "has yet to be matched" (223). Though we might have lost the Enlightenment's robust teleological assumption of progress, it would be destructive to be satisfied with the saying, as common today as it was in Kant's time: "that may be correct in theory, but is of no use in practice." It is usually stated by people who (in Kant's words) fix their "dim moles' eyes" on experience only, denying that human eyes belong "to a being that was made to stand erect and look at heavens."[1] As long as we cannot prove the impossibility of realizing the ideals shaping the world we want, it is both irrational and immoral to stop promoting them. It is highly commendable that Robert B. Louden reminds us of the practical impact of hope. Rich in empirical study and powerful in philosophical analysis, Louden's book belies everybody who declares the Enlightenment project dead. Once again the author of Kant's Impure Ethics presents an impressive volume.

[1] Cf. I. Kant, On the Common Saying: That May be Correct in Theory, but is of no Use in Practice, 8:277.