The Wrong of Injustice: Dehumanization and its Role in Feminist Philosophy

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Mari Mikkola, The Wrong of Injustice: Dehumanization and its Role in Feminist Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2016, 285pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190601089.

Reviewed by John Gardner, University of Oxford


Mari Mikkola's book has two parts, one negative and the other positive. The negative part documents the failure of attempts to provide a satisfactory 'thick' account of the concept of a woman. The positive part argues that the wrongfulness of various actions is owed to the fact that they are dehumanizing. One may ask why these two seemingly disparate projects are juxtaposed in a single book. The answer is that the book as a whole aims to draw feminists away from debates about what it is to be a woman, and towards debates about how we should treat human beings. That does not mean paying less attention to the predicament of women. There can be 'humanist feminism' (44), because 'every first-order moral theory should be feminist in facilitating the quest for gendered social justice' (178). Placing dehumanization at the heart of moral theory ticks that box for Mikkola. Women tend to suffer dehumanization qua women, and a focus on dehumanization helps to bring that fact into relief without the need to invoke any 'thick' account of the concept of a woman.

A 'thick' account is contrasted with one in which 'thin and superficial extensional intuitions enable us to pick out women's social kind' sufficiently to engage in the feminist moral theory of Part II (142). If Mikkola is right that a 'thin' account will suffice for the purpose of Part II, then she did not need to show that attempts to produce a satisfactory 'thick' account have failed. Since the product is not going to be needed, the failure to produce it is neither here nor there. That being so, the case for having compiled Parts I and II into a single volume is weakened. I will accordingly treat the two Parts separately.

In Part I Mikkola divides 'thick' accounts (she often prefers 'conceptions') of the concept of a woman into 'nominalist' and 'realist' flavours. Segregating the two turns out to be tricky, and the distinction ends up serving mainly a presentational role in the book, allowing a daunting literature review to be spread across two chapters instead of one. The survey could have been made more useful, more concise, and in its negative verdict perhaps more convincing, by two additions: (a) a clearer up-front statement of what makes an account of a concept 'thick'; and (b) benchmarks for success in providing such an account.

On point (a) one begins with the impression that Mikkola's talk of 'thick social' conceptions of woman (5, 45) is harmlessly pleonastic, i.e. that a conception is thick if and only if it includes social criteria. But this turns out to be quite wrong. Even in some 'thin' conceptions woman is to be cast as a social kind (105). The difference between 'thick' and 'thin' rests on philosophical ambition: the 'thin' theorist makes do with common extensional verdicts (shared judgments that this is a woman) where the 'thick' theorist looks also for common intensional explanations for such verdicts (shared use of such-and-such as criteria by which this is a woman). It seems odd to describe extensional commonality as commonality in 'conception'. How can such commonality even go as far as revealing that woman is a social kind? How can it disclose what is needed for the purposes of Part II, namely that woman is a human kind? If there is no intensional explanation of our convergence then we have no concept of an A, and there are (for us) no As. In that case we did not converge on our verdicts according to which these are As; it was all a misunderstanding. Mikkola is well aware of the problem that, if we lack the concept of a woman, then for us 'there are no women' (46). But I could not see how settling for a 'thin conception', which is strictly speaking no conception at all, was meant to avoid that pitfall.

This problem seems to force Mikkola into an equivocation. That we designate someone as 'woman' 'should not be taken to inform us about some underlying concept [of woman] that our language use supposedly expresses' (110, emphasis in original). But weren't we told that the topic of discussion was going to be 'conception[s] of the concept woman' (2, emphasis added) and that only 'thick' conceptions would be eschewed? Maybe there was a pleonasm after all. Maybe all and only 'thick' theorists have conceptions. 'Thin' theorists have . . . what?

On point (b), Mikkola struck me as setting some excessively demanding benchmarks that stack the deck against the success of 'thick' accounts. In fairness, many of the writers surveyed seem to stack the deck no less effectively against themselves. Mikkola does a good job of exposing some of the millstones that those interested in the concept of a woman have hung around their philosophical necks. There is the obscure imperative to avoid 'essentialism' (28-30). This sometimes inspires a futile search for an account of the concept of a woman that has nothing to say about the nature of a woman - a search, in Mikkola's terminology, for a 'semantics' that does not implicate an 'ontology' (27-8). Mikkola makes short work of this idea. She does a similarly effective job of explaining how analysis of the concept of a woman has been obstructed by the perceived need to find a role for the received and overhyped distinction between 'sex' and 'gender' (125ff). Mikkola has her own interesting proposals for redrawing that distinction to make it less of a millstone for feminist philosophers.

Other millstones, however, go unchecked. Mikkola appears to share with some she criticises a longing for what might be called 'conceptual parity'. This comes to light most strikingly in her treatment of Natalie Stoljar's 'resemblance nominalism' (65-9). Stoljar lists four 'woman paradigms' and classifies candidates as women according to how closely they resemble the paradigms. My first reaction to Stoljar's list (67) was that, though a list of women, it was surely not a list of paradigmatic women. One of the supposed paradigms (an intersex person who lives as a woman) struck me as falling close to the penumbra of the concept, in which indeterminacy reigns. Both that paradigm and another (a male-to-female transsexual who attributes womanness to herself) also struck me as derivative (or secondary) cases of womanhood. There must be such a thing as a woman imaginable apart from the attribution of womanness to oneself if there is to be such a thing as womanness to attribute to oneself.

Never mind whether these reactions of mine are sound. The interesting thing is that Mikkola's reactions go the other way. She resists the idea that the concept of a woman has a penumbra and that there are secondary cases: 'whether [someone] should resemble a woman paradigm in two or [in] three respects to count as a woman is pivotal' (68). It seems to Mikkola that those covered by the concept of a woman must all be covered alike by the concept; working from central or primary cases of womanhood is not the way forward (111). That is what I mean when I speak of her attachment to 'conceptual parity'. It creates a severe obstacle to the success of any 'thick' account.

This obstacle may to be connected to another. For Mikkola it is required of any successful account of the concept of a woman that it 'serve[s] the goal of fighting gender injustice' (84). This is not to turn 'woman' into a 'feminist technical term' (87, 121). She expects an account of who counts nontechnically as a woman, but one that also serves the feminist goal: 'the challenge is not merely to elucidate some ontological parts of reality . . . [but] to elucidate parts that serve feminist politics' (101).

The word 'serve' in these formulations is misleading. Mikkola is not requiring the proponents of 'thick' accounts to excel (or help others excel) in vote-winning, propaganda-spreading, or rabble-rousing. By 'serve' she means something like 'keep faith with'; the aim is that, when we call upon a 'thick' conception, getting the crucial "feminist message" across is not compromised (84). What is this crucial feminist message? That is not so obvious. If any concept in these parts has a larger penumbra of indeterminacy than 'woman', it is surely 'feminist'.

Mikkola lists a few aspects of what she takes to be the crucial feminist message, one being 'to elucidate how and why patriarchy damages women' (84). That's a good first shot. But it also reveals that the problems with invoking feminist goals in attempting to nail down the concept of a woman do not stop at indeterminacy. There is also the problem that the concept of a feminist passes the buck back to the concept of a woman. We need to know what a woman is to know what a feminist is. Does Mikkola ever get past this problem? Not so far as I could see. Consider her refrain that a 'thick' account of the concept of a woman 'should be inclusive' (46 and passim). It is natural to ask: inclusive of what? The answer: the account should 'recognize women's diversity' (46). Recognizing diversity is fine (a decent account of the concept of a haircut or an illness or a holiday recognizes the diversity of such things) but which diversity, we may ask, counts as women's diversity? The buck is passed, once again, back to those attempting to work out what a woman is.

Possibly Mikkola wants those attempting to work out what a woman is to err on the side of inclusion in penumbral cases. Before we can do that, however, we need to know where the penumbra is. We need an unadjusted 'thick' conception, in other words, before we can adjust it in the name of feminist political largesse. Mikkola's insistence that 'thick' conceptions must be inclusive even prior to adjustment may help explain her attachment to conceptual parity. She takes it that if we allow for penumbral and derivative cases, we somehow make it the case that there are first- and second-class women. Be that as it may, such insistence sets all 'thick' conceptions up to fail. Had she established more reasonable benchmarks of success, she would not have been able to point to so much failure among those who came before her. And she would not have been able to get away so easily with her recommendation that we all give up the search.

Part II of the book heads in a different direction. It starts with a thought-provoking chapter on 'Dehumanization'. It was reading this chapter in an earlier version that led me to want to read the book, where I hoped to find the ideas developed in greater depth and detail. Much of the chapter reads like a straightforward exercise in 'first-order moral theory', to borrow Mikkola's own description (2). Mikkola uses rape as her model of a dehumanizing action, and assesses previous attempts (including mine) to capture what is dehumanizing about it. Her arguments alerted me to some major flaws in my older views. However these arguments are not typical of Part II of the book. It does not, for the most part, develop the first-order ethics of chapter 6. It turns out to be dominated by second-order concerns, principally: what first-order moral theory, or what first-order moral ideas, should a feminist embrace?

Presumably a feminist should embrace the same first-order moral ideas as anyone else, viz. all and only the right ones. Feminism surely answers to ethics, rather than ethics answering to feminism. Indeed, in a roundabout way, that is Mikkola's own thesis, and the main basis of her criticisms. She wants feminists to do their ethics without specifically feminist inputs. For she thinks that a sound 'humanist' ethics, free of specifically feminist inputs, will still have specifically feminist outputs (147). In light of this thesis it is curious, bordering on paradoxical, that Mikkola frames the master-problem as the problem of which actions a feminist should classify as wrong. Her official line is that humanists should be feminists, but Part II seems more concerned to persuade those who are already feminists that they should be humanists.

Sticking to the official line, one now expects the same sorts of problems to arise in connection with the concept of a human as were brought out in connection with the concept of a woman. A choice has to be made between 'thin' and 'thick' accounts, between working with paradigms and not doing so, between tolerance of penumbral cases and no such tolerance, and so on (179). Yet the differences between Mikkola's treatment of the two concepts are dramatic to the point of being disorientating. First, discussion of who is human and why is limited to a few pages (146-8, 164, 179-82), as compared with upwards of 120 pages given to the concept of a woman. Second, the solutions adopted concerning the concept of a human differ without explanation from those concerning the concept of a woman.

Mikkola claims that she is invoking only a 'thin' conception of 'human being' (179). But according to the distinction used in Part I, it is in fact a 'thick' conception. True, it is not an 'ethically thick' conception; Mikkola 'does not rely on any controversial evaluative understanding of humanity' (179, emphases added). Yet she does cast human as a 'biological kind' (147). Having got this 'thick', however, she does not entertain the possibility, central to her discussion of the concept of a woman, that social criteria of the human are needed in addition to, or substitution for, biological ones. And whereas there was a taste for what I called 'conceptual parity' in connection with the concept of a woman, with the concept of a human we are allowed to trade on (unspecified) 'typical paradigm features of human beings' and invited 'not [to] have clear and rigid boundaries' (147).

That reproductive rights will be put under severe pressure by a view of humanity as a 'biological kind' seems so obvious that, initially, it strikes one as incredible that Mikkola allows the subject to pass with a remark that 'these concerns . . . do not bear on my argument here' (147). What could be more dehumanising than, say, the disposal of foetal tissue with general clinical waste? How can one possibly keep this challenge at bay armed only with a biological conception of the human favoured for its inclusiveness? How will such a conception serve as 'a tool with which we can advance humanist feminism' (179)? And how are we going to avoid 'getting bogged down by . . . conceptual problems' concerning humanity (149), just as the feminists of Part I did concerning womanhood?

Mikkola has an answer - of sorts. She proposes to shift the argumentative burden from the concept of a human being to the concept of dehumanization. She aims to do so by (i) taking 'rape as a paradigm case,' then (ii) working out 'what are the key features that make it' dehumanizing, and from there (iii) 'develop[ing] a general account of dehumanization' (147-8). Yet surely the 'key features' that make something dehumanizing are going to be bound up with, and explained by, the 'key features' that make someone human. So it looks like work on the concept of dehumanization may force us to circle back for a re-examination of the concept of a human being.

Is Mikkola's explanation of dehumanization independent enough of explanation of a human being to avoid this? She rightly warns against a wooden interpretation of the word in which dehumanizers 'literally turn a someone into a something' (182). Nor is dehumanizing 'about conceiving some individuals as "lesser" persons' (182). Yet in some sense, it still seems to be a matter of treating someone as if she were not human. This leads one to wonder: Don't we treat someone as if she were not human whenever we treat her in a way that a human being shouldn't be treated? Aren't we faced, at this point, with a large space into which slots all of moral and political philosophy, or at least that part of it that deals with the question of 'what we owe to each other'? In that case, placing dehumanization at the centre of one's 'first-order moral theory' promises little progress. Saying 'don't dehumanize me' means, roughly, 'treat me right'.

This impression is reinforced elsewhere. Take Mikkola's canonical formulation: 'An act or a treatment is dehumanizing if and only if it is an indefensible setback to some of our legitimate human interests, where this setback constitutes a moral injury' (164). 'In breach of a moral right' could be substituted for 'dehumanizing' here and few would blink. Mikkola anticipates and resists such a substitution. She is not trying 'to account for moral wrongfulness as such,' but only 'one particular kind of wrongfulness, namely that found at the core of social injustice' (167). What distinguishes this wrongfulness is that it 'wrongs everyone qua human alike' (151). So 'rape wrongs everyone qua human beings, although individuals are differently harmed' by it, and members of some groups more often and more systematically harmed than others (151). It follows that 'patriarchy is not a problem just for women; it is a problem for everyone' (185).

In spite of some reformulations in the book, I was not sure how to interpret the proposal that a dehumanizing act such as rape 'wrongs everyone qua human alike.' It could conceivably mean that, whenever someone is raped, that someone is wronged qua human. But I think Mikkola intends the syntactically more natural yet morally more startling reading according to which, whenever someone is raped, everyone is simultaneously wronged qua human. Is that view compatible with the view that the someone raped is wronged in a special way? Does she have a right that is violated by the rape beyond her right, shared with everyone, that there be no rapes? I would like to think so.

The suggestion that we are all wronged whenever someone is raped drives Mikkola into the same knotty set of issues faced by those trying to understand what makes a crime into a 'crime against humanity', on which there is a large literature. I did not see her confront these issues, or show much awareness of them. In general I found Mikkola's attempt to create a 'general account of dehumanization', one that narrowed the relevant class of wrongs down in all and only the ways that it was supposed to do, rather mysterious. I don't mean that her eventual criterion ('the interest violation involves false or unjustified beliefs pertaining to some social identity marker,' 174) is mysterious (although it is a bit). I mean that the explanation of why that is the marker of a dehumanizing wrong is mysterious. There is a shortage of argument here. At times I had the impression that Mikkola began with a list of wrongs to which she wanted to attach special importance by labelling them 'social injustices', and to which she also wanted to direct special outrage by labelling them 'dehumanizing', and then crafted her criterion accordingly.

I have persisted in reviewing Part II as a contribution to 'first-order moral theory'. If it is really focused on why feminists should be humanists then the shortage of moral argument is not very surprising or troubling. The same focus would also explain why, when Mikkola comes to discuss oppression, domination, and discrimination as 'core forms of contemporary social injustice' (1), she engages only cursorily with the extensive and detailed work in 'first-order moral theory' that exists on each. Her chosen interlocutors are skewed towards those with a feminist self-understanding. That, we should perhaps conclude, is because her topics are not actually oppression, domination, and discrimination, but rather what feminist philosophers, aiming to garner 'a broader base' (185) and 'make feminism genuinely inclusive' (42), should all be saying about these things.

Since I think feminist philosophers should aim not to agree, but rather to be disputatious and iconoclastic, I find this topic inherently disappointing. Perhaps I should have paid less attention to the main title of the book, which corroborated my assumptions about where its arguments would lead, and more attention to the subtitle. But even this is apt to mislead. Dehumanization, it turns out, has had little role in feminist philosophy. That is what Mikkola bemoans, and aims to put right. To register her complaint, she engages with other feminist philosophers on a disparate range of topics, often seeming to be less interested in their topics than in their feminism.

As a feminist and a philosopher, I subscribe to Mikkola's official line that we should avoid feminist inputs and instead take comfort in feminist outputs as they emerge. Already persuaded on that point, I found the book didactic and a bit patronizing. It contains too much declaration of its author's convictions, too much concern to cement political alliances, and too little doing of the thing that it says should be done, viz. first-order moral theorizing in a broadly humanist vein. It would have served Mikkola better to follow her own advice: get on with the ethics and let the feminist conclusions look after themselves.