The Yablo Paradox: An Essay on Circularity

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Roy T Cook, The Yablo Paradox: An Essay on Circularity, Oxford University Press, 2014, 193pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669608.

Reviewed by Eduardo Alejandro Barrio, National Scientific and Technical Research Council/University of Buenos Aires


Roy Cook's new book is a very important contribution to the literature on semantic paradoxes. Its main topic is Yablo's paradox: a denumerably infinite sequence of sentences S1, S2, S3, . . ., each of which claims that all sentences occurring later in the series are not true:

(S1) For all k>1, Sk is untrue

(S2) For all k>2, Sk is untrue

(S3) For all k>3, Sk is untrue

. . .

(Sn) For all k>n, Sk is untrue

. . .

According to Stephen Yablo (1985, 1993), this sequence generates a liar-like paradox without any kind of circularity involved: no sentence in the Yablo list seems to refer to itself, and unlike liar cycles, no sentence seems to refer to sentences above it in the list. The importance of Yablo's paradox lies in the fact that it challenges a two-millennia old assumption that semantic paradoxes are caused by circularity (and, correspondingly, that one promising reaction to the paradoxes is the elimination of all circularity). However, this issue has been the focus of a fascinating discussion. For example, Graham Priest (1997) and JC Beall (2001) have instead argued that the paradox involves a fixed-point construction, and as a result of this the list is basically circular.[1] Roy Sorensen (1998) and Otávio Bueno and Mark Colyvan (2003) hold that circularity is not present in the Yablo sequence. Cook, on the other hand, argues against Yablo's point showing that the list of Yablo sentences, as formulated within arithmetic, is circular, but only in a weak sense. Cook's thesis is that the circularity involved in the original Yablo construction is not distinct from the sort found in the arithmetic Liar. In his own words:

If the existence of a weak fixed point (or either sort) is sufficient to justify branding the construction in question "circular," then the involvement of a weak predicate fixed point such as the Yablo predicate "Y(x)" would seem to be no different, in principle, than the involvement of a weak sentential fixed point such as that involved in the arithmetic Liar. (p. 103)

Nonetheless, he rejects the view that this sort of circularity (fixed point) can be a plausible cause of the paradox and, more importantly, a plausible cause of paradox, for it is too broad and widely spread to have any relevance. His argument takes into account that every unary predicate (in a strong enough language) is a weak fixed point of some binary predicate, and every statement is a weak sentential fixed point of some unary predicate. Hence, according to him, this mathematical fact seems to throw serious doubts on the prospects of explaining the roots of paradoxes in terms of the presence of (this sort of weak fixed point) circularity. Cook emphasizes that the sort of circularity found both in the Liar and the Yablo paradox is an innocuous type of circularity, inasmuch as this sort of circularity is endemic throughout arithmetic.

However, according to Cook, a non-circular paradox is possible. An important achievement of this book is to provide a new construction formulated in an infinitary formal language that is not circular at all. Thus, Cook's list shows that circularity is not the cause of all paradoxes and that there are non-circular paradoxes. In short, although the original formulation of the Yablo paradox is circular, it turns out that it is not circular in any sense that can bear the blame for the paradox. Further, formulations of the paradox using infinitary conjunctions provide genuinely non-circular constructions.

It is important to note that the book is about much more than Yablo's infinitary construction, indeed it is an amazing contribution to our understanding of the role that circularity plays in our analysis, diagnosis, and attempted solutions to paradoxes. Cook says:

the present focus is not motivated by a belief that the Yablo paradox is more important or more interesting that the Liar (although the Yablo construction, is, in my opinion, immensely interesting in and of itself), or by a belief that solving this particular paradox is more important than a solution to the Liar paradox (again, understood with all the relevant caveats regarding what might count as a solution in place). (p. 3)

Cook provides a systematic and comprehensive study about the most important semantic puzzles such as the Liar, the Curry and -- of course -- the infinitary paradoxes such as Yablo's sequences.

Cook raises and answers three main questions that can be (and have been) asked about the Yablo construction: first, the Characterization Problem, which asks what patterns of sentential reference (circular or not) generate semantic paradoxes; second, the Circularity Question, which addresses the question of whether the Yablo paradox is genuinely non-circular; and finally, the Generalizability Question, which deals with whether the Yabloesque pattern can be used to generate genuinely non-circular variants of other paradoxes, such as epistemic and set-theoretic paradoxes. Cook offers many arguments in support of this idea, although there are general constructions (using his terminology "unwindings") that transform circular constructions into Yablo-like sequences. This type of constructions is not 'well-behaved' when it is transferred from semantic puzzles to puzzles of other sorts. I find the book very productive to engage with and far-reaching.

In chapter 1, Cook provides the technical apparatus and the philosophical background that will be required in order to address the Circularity Question and the Generalizability Question in the rest of the book. The Chapter also deals with the Characterization Problem directly. Different variations of the Yablo paradox are presented and examined. In particular, Cook presents a purposed-build infinitary language LP in which certain paradoxes can be represented. This language only contains one type of formula: (possibly infinite) conjunctions of sentences of the form  'Sn is false', where Sn is the name of a sentence of LP. Cook uses a function δ to provide the denotation of every sentence name. For example, the Liar sentence can by expressed by F(S1), where δ(S1) = F(S1). Now the Cook-Yablo sequence consists of the set {Sn}n∊ω under the denotation function δ(Sn) = {F(Sm): m∊ω m>n}. This sequence can be expressed as "the unwinding" of the Liar sentence:

δ(S1) = F(S2)  F(S3)  F(S4)  . . .

δ(S2) = F(S3)  F(S4)  F(S5)  . . .

δ(S3) = F(S4)  F(S5)  F(S6)  . . .

. . . . . . .

. . . . . . .

Cook focuses on the following question: "Given a generalized notion of a Yabloesque sequence within LP -- that is, an ω-sequence of sentences, each of which asserts the falsity of some (but not necessarily all) of the sentences 'below' it in the list -- which such Yabloesque LP constructions are paradoxical?" (p. 6). For the details, you will have to read the book. Many of them really are fascinating. Roughly, Cook defines a notion of dependence according to which a sentence Sn depends on others if and only if it asserts that the latter are false, and then proves many interesting results. One of the most important is:

THEOREM 1.3.1: Any Yabloesque chain that displays a transitive dependency relation is paradoxical. (p. 44)

Yablo's Paradox and the Liar both exhibit transitive dependency relations and are two specific instances of a more general phenomenon.

Cook also shows that Yablo's Paradox has a dual form of the set {Sn}nω, where for each n:

(Sn) Some k>n and Sk is untrue.

The dual form of Yablo's Paradox can be formulated within LP using infinite disjunctions in place of existential quantification:

δ(Sn) = v {F(Sn): nω}

Results similar to Yablo's sequence hold for this construction. Determining what patterns of dependency between sentences generate paradox is a challenging project. One of the great virtues of the book is to exhibit what general conditions produce paradox. Furthermore, one important general result of the chapter is to show some intimate mathematical connections between investigation of the logical properties of languages such as LP and a class of important problems in the mathematical theory of directed graphs.

The main proposal of Chapter 2 is to examine and analyze the Circularity Question. Cook begins by asking what is meant when one says that a particular linguistic construction is circular. Of course, there are different notions of circularity. Hannes Leitgeb (2002) has explored the idea that we can determine whether linguistic constructions such as the Liar paradox or the Yablo paradox are non-circular by drawing connections between the referential structure of these constructions and the structure of certain non-well-founded sets. Cook analyzes this thesis and calls it the structural collapse. The idea is that such a thesis might help us to answer the circularity question. While he rejects this collapse in the end of the chapter for a number of reasons, he shows that there are interesting technical connections between one of the non-well-founded set theories explored in the chapter and the development of unwindings carried out in Chapter 3. Of course, the Yablo paradox, when constructed via Gödelian diagonalization within arithmetic, is circular. But Cook shows that this does not mean that the general referential pattern exhibited by the Yablo paradox cannot give rise to non-circular paradoxes in other contexts. Specifically, Cook argues that this Yabloesque infinitary sequence within LP is a genuinely non-circular paradox. In particular, he proves THEOREM 2.4.4: "Given any denotation function δ such that: δ(Sn) = ∧{F(Sm) : m  ω and m > n} there is no k  ω such that δ(Sk) is a weak fixed point of <{Sn}nω, δ>" (pp. 119-120). It is clear that the absence of weak fixed points seems to be enough to show the non-circularity of the construction. Then, the proof that none of the sentences of LP involved in the construction are fixed points shows that there are non-circular constructions that are paradoxical.

In Chapter 3 Cook addresses the Generalizability Question, which examines the prospects for generalizing the Yablo construction -- that is, what criteria an operation would need to meet in order for it to successfully "transform" circular paradoxes (and other circular constructions) into non-circular analogues. It is well known that Sorensen proposes a "general purge of self-reference":

There is a wide family of paradoxes that are loosely characterized as self- referential. The simplicity of Yablo's technique invites the conjecture that all of these paradoxes can be purged of self-reference. The conjecture could be demonstrated if there were a standard formalization of the self-referential puzzles. For one could then formulate an algorithm that mechanically transforms self-referential puzzles into Yabloesque versions. Unfortunately, there is no standard formalization. (Sorensen, 1998, p. 150)

The most promising method for carrying out such a purge -- unwindings -- are then examined by Cook. Specifically, he considers two options: unwindings in Pointer Semantics and unwindings in arithmetic. For the first case, he shows that the original unwinding recipe does seem like a promising technique for attempting to carry out Sorensen's general purge of self-reference -- at least, on its weak version. Cook admits that the methods examined in this case are somewhat limited since they only apply to the rather expressively impoverished language LP. For the second case, Cook claims:

If we are working in a language strong enough to prove Gödel's diagonalization result and we are interested in fixed points of predicates that, at a minimum, are upward and downward predicate-closed, then none of our unwinding recipes . . . provides us with a paradox that does not involve sentential fixed points. (p. 168)

This final point partially vindicates the argument given in Priest (1997) that the Yablo paradox, as formulated within arithmetic, supplemented with a truth predicate involves circularity -- although for Cook the circularity is located in a rather different place than is suggested by Priest.

Finally in Chapter 4 Cook presents the Curry Generalization. According to Cook, "if the Yablo paradox is, loosely speaking, a sort of infinitary generalization (or "unwinding") of the Liar paradox, then it is natural to ask whether there is a version of the Curry paradox that has the Yablo paradox . . . as special cases" (p. 8). Cook explores this strategy by presenting constructions of Curry-like Yabloesque paradoxes. Then, he examines which consequences their existence might have for theorizing about Yabloesque paradoxes in particular, and semantic paradoxes in general.

The argument for a new genuine non-circular paradox

As we have seen, one of the most important results of the book is to offer a genuine non-circular paradox formulated in an infinitary language. The absence of weak fixed points is a key factor to show the non-circularity of the infinitary construction. Of course, a way to deny such achievement as a genuine paradox is to reject infinitary systems. In particular, it is possible to deny the validity of the rules, such as the omega rule or a version of it, the Conjunction Introduction Rule of Cook's system. Graham Priest, for example, claims that nobody can actually use an infinitary rule, and that when we talk "as if" we performed one, it is actually finite information that is justifying us (Priest, 1997). In Cook's systems, proofs may be infinitely long. This fact could disturb us.

However, according to Cook, Priest's objection

relies on the idea that we might restrict the notion of truth . . . to natural languages or finitary languages (or both). The motivation for such a restriction, one assumes, would be the observation that all language users that we have heretofore come into contact with (and, importantly, all languages users that matter) speak finitary languages that do not allow for the construction of the truly non-circular paradox as sketched. (p. 126)

Nonetheless, Cook's objection is that restricting our account of truth (and our development of a view on the semantic paradoxes) to languages that we are able to speak looks worryingly provincial.

It is crucial to note that Cook changes the focus of the discussion. There are two different problems:

ONTOLOGICAL: Is there any infinite sequence that represents the truth predicate of some infinitary language and is not circular?

EPISTEMOLOGICAL: Could a being with our epistemic capabilities know that infinite sequence by non-circular means?

According to Cook, the main discussion about Yablo's paradox revolves around the ontological problem. First, logic is modeling truth preservation, and not all systems of logic are complete. Second, logic is used to describe mathematical structures. Infinitary languages, whose models are structures under study, might raise conceptual problems, as Yablo's construction seems to show.

The argument for going beyond PA

I sympathize with Cook's response to Priest's point: the circularity involved in PA is too broad to be relevant. The sort of circularity found in the Yablo sequence formulated in PA overgeneralizes: all arithmetic predicates turn out to be circular. But this cannot be the case. So, another very important contribution of the book is to raise doubts about how to model circularity in a family of languages. Although the book does not give a definitive answer to this challenge, it allows the clear identification of the complexity of the task and challenge some of the strategies commonly adopted. Another advantage of using the infinitary strategy is avoiding some problems of capturing the Yablo sequence in PA. If one makes the rather plausible assumption that a set of sentences can only be a paradox if it entails a contradiction, then if the Yablo paradox is formulated within PA, supplemented with a truth predicate, it is not a paradox. Of course, as is pointed out by Ketland (2005, p. 165), this is an immediate consequence of the compactness theorem for first-order logic: if this set of Yablo sentences formulated within PA were inconsistent, some finite subset would be inconsistent as well (which can easily be seen not to be the case). However, Cook shows the existence of an infinitary proof of a contradiction from the individual sentences constituting the Yablo paradox within LP, where no corresponding finite proof exists in Peano arithmetic. This upshot is another reason for going beyond PA.

In my opinion, this strategy is inconclusive. As Ketland (2005) also shows, the Yablo sequence within PA is ω-inconsistent. This result implies that the list does not have a standard model. That is, there is no model whose domain is the set of natural numbers in which Yablo's list could acquire a consistent interpretation. Barrio (2010) and Picollo (2012) exhibit some conceptual problems associated with ω-inconsistency and Yablo's Paradox. If one accepts that the circularity involved in PA is "too broad to be taken into account", these difficulties could be taken as evidence for believing that what we have is a good non-circular representation (in the right sense) of the list of Yablo's sentences within PA. Moreover, second-order arithmetic with standard semantics avoids the existence of non-standard models. Thus, adding Yablo's sequence to this theory produces a theory of truth that doesn't have a model. I think that if a theory of truth that is ω-inconsistent is a bad thing, having an unsatisfiable theory is even worse. In this case, unlike Cook's approach, one shows that adding Yablo's list to arithmetic produces serious problems. Barrio and Picollo (2013) shows the risks of adopting ω-inconsistent truth theories for arithmetic: the revision theory of nearly stable truth T# and the classical theory of symmetric truth FS. Thus, Yablo's sequence within PA, although not strictly speaking paradoxical, could be showing the same conceptual problems. Of course, Cook is right: logic is modeling truth preservation. Infinitary languages might raise conceptual problems as Yablo's construction seems to show. But these are additional problems to languages without quantifiers. I prefer not to limit the problems to infinitary languages.


Barrio, E. (2010), "Theories of truth without standard models and Yablo's sequences", Studia Logica, 96, pp. 375-391.

Barrio, E and Picollo, L. (2013) "Notes on ω-inconsistent Theories of Truth in Second-Order Languages", The Review of Symbolic Logic, Vol 6, n 4. pp 733-741.

Beall, JC. (2001), "Is Yablo's paradox non circular?, Analysis, 61, pp. 176-187.

Bueno, O. and Colyvan, M. (2003), "Paradox without satisfaction", Analysis, 63, pp. 152-156.

Ketland, J. (2005), "Yablo's Paradox and omega-inconsistency", Synthese, 145, pp. 295-307.

Leitgeb, H. (2002), "What is a Self-referential Sentence? Critical remarks on the alleged (non-)Circularity of Yablo's Paradox", Logique and Analyse, 177, pp. 3-14.

Picollo, L. (2013), "Yablo's Paradox in Second-Order Languages: Consistency and Unsatisfiability", Studia Logica, Vol. 101, (2013) pp. 601-613.

Priest, G. (1997), "Yablo's Paradox", Analysis, 57, pp. 236-242.

Sorensen, R. (1998), "Yablo's paradox and kindred infinite liars", Mind, 107, pp. 137-155.

Yablo, S. (1985), "Truth and reflection", Journal of Philosophical Logic, 14, pp. 297-349.

--- (1993), "Paradox without self-reference", Analysis, 53 (4), pp. 251-252.

[1] In order to express Yablo’s sequence in the language of first-order arithmetic, an unary predicate Y(x) is needed, the Yablo predicate. The Yablo sentences are then Y(1), Y(2), … , such as for every n, the following equivalence holds {Y(x)↔ ∀x > n, ¬ Tr(Y(x)}.