The Young Derrida and French Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Edward Baring, The Young Derrida and French Philosophy, 1945-1968, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 326pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107009677.

Reviewed by Samir Haddad, Fordham University


This is a rich and fascinating book. Edward Baring presents Jacques Derrida's early writings in a completely new light, reading them as specific responses to precisely defined debates in the Parisian intellectual community. His approach is refreshingly different from other accounts of Derrida's development, which, as he notes, tend to follow the philosopher's own (later) self-understanding as that of a marginalized outsider. This goes hand in hand with a vision of Derrida in dialogue only with the Greats. Instead, Baring describes a young man fully immersed in the French philosophical mainstream, albeit located "in those curious margins at its heart, straddling divides between the religious and the secular, Catholics and communists, phenomenologists and structuralists" (20). Taking this approach allows Baring to make a genuinely original contribution to the literature, and students and scholars will learn much about the development of both Derrida's philosophy and French philosophy as a whole in the postwar period.

Being the first account of Derrida's work based on extensive archival research, this book brings to interpretative debates much that has been hitherto unknown. This is one of the book's strengths, and reading the many archival revelations in its clear and attractive prose was for me both illuminating and pleasurable, even exciting at times. At the same time, reading this kind of work poses a certain challenge. For it is a premise of interpretative agreement and disagreement that all parties have access to the texts. Much of the material discussed here, however, is only available onsite in archives in Normandy and California. This in no way detracts from Baring's achievement, and in a sense it's not his problem. As an intellectual historian, he's simply doing his job in unearthing archival material that no one has read. But it does limit the level of critical engagement that the reader can pursue. In what follows, therefore, my few criticisms are couched in terms of persuasiveness and coherence. Deeper dispute over many of the arguments of this book will require first going to the archives and reading for oneself.

 * * * * * * * * * * * * *

Baring discusses Derrida's development chronologically, dividing the dates in the book's title into three main periods, plus a coda. First, he examines philosophy essays written by Derrida as a lycée student in Algiers and Paris (1945-1951). Next is Derrida's study of Husserl, from his enrollment at the Ecole Normale Supérieure (ENS) to the publication of his translation and introduction to Husserl's Origin of Geometry (1952-1962). Third, Baring analyzes Derrida's work leading up to the publication of Writing and Difference, Speech and Phenomena, and Of Grammatology (1962-1967). Finally, the book closes with a brief reading of "The Ends of Man" (1968).

The first two chapters discuss the time of Derrida's adolescence. In Chapter 1, Baring provides a snapshot of French philosophy in 1945 by presenting Sartre's Existentialism is a Humanism in relation to its context. He persuasively shows how, by embracing humanism, Sartre strategically positioned himself vis-à-vis the dominant political division of his time, that between the French Communist Party and the Catholic Social Democrats. Sartre argued that the humanism of his atheistic existentialism was superior to that offered by the philosophies supporting both sides of this divide. With an optimistic account of collective action, aiming to avoid the charges of bourgeois individualism coming from the Marxists, and pessimistic nihilism from the Christian existentialists, Sartre successfully established the political relevance of his philosophy. But, Baring argues, Sartre's identification of his existentialism with a humanism was a double-edged sword, for when the latter term fell out of favor in the early 1950s it precipitated a swift drop in Sartre's standing among philosophers. The attacks relevant to Baring's narrative focused on Sartre's reading of the phenomenological tradition, with Marxist phenomenologists interpreting Husserl as a philosopher of science rather than of subjectivity, and Catholic existentialists interpreting Heidegger as an anti-humanist.

While this anti-humanist turn would influence Derrida later, it is the first phase, that of Sartre's preeminence and the general acceptance of humanism, that forms the background for the young Derrida's initial engagement with philosophy. Baring explores this in Chapter 2 by examining several essays Derrida wrote as a lycée student in Algiers and Paris. Some aspects of Derrida's adolescent writings are as one would expect. We read of a sixteen year old in 1946 who "showed an allegiance to existentialist philosophy, with an almost total reliance on Sartre's vocabulary" (50), and who two years later, at an after-school philosophy club, presents the thought of Husserl and Heidegger through a predominantly Sartrian lens. More surprising, however, is Baring's claim that Derrida was at this time deeply influenced by Christian existentialism. Baring argues that Derrida turned to such thought to overcome Sartre's lack of a moral philosophy. Derrida thus used arguments by Gabriel Marcel, Simone Weil, and above all René le Senne to correct what he perceived to be a problematic limitation in Sartre's position.

That Christian existentialism was crucial to the young Derrida's thinking is a striking revelation, for it is absent from Derrida's own accounts of his development as well as from the existing secondary literature. However, it is also worth noting that there is in Baring's account some ambiguity on this point. He states in his Introduction that "The fact that Derrida drew on Christian philosophy does not make his philosophy doctrinally 'Christian,' and it in no way implies that Derrida accepted Christian doctrines personally; we should beware of mistaking philosophical genealogy for religious identity" (6-7). But leaving identity aside, how we should understand the young Derrida's philosophical position is not altogether clear.

Again in the Introduction, Baring implies that Derrida used Christian ideas instrumentally. He writes that "at the close of the Second World War, Derrida aligned himself -- though as we shall see, not without some reserve -- with Sartre," and that he "turned to Christian thought, not because it was Christian, but because, in France, it offered the most valuable resources for criticizing Sartre's atheistic existentialism" (7). Here Sartre occupies the center, with Christian thought on the periphery. By contrast, Chapter 2 carries the title "Derrida's 'Christian' Existentialism." Even with the scare quotes -- perhaps signaling Baring's hesitation -- this suggests a stronger affiliation. And some of the claims quoted here point to a more positive embrace of Christian thinking. For example, Baring presents Derrida as coming close to endorsing a belief in God, and at one point cites the young philosopher describing his position as an "existential spiritualism" (65). Christian thought here seems much more than just a critical tool.

It may well be that there is no single view expressed in Derrida's lycée essays -- indeed, to have developed a fully coherent philosophical position at such a young age would be even more surprising. But the uncertain status of Christian thinking here should make one pause, for at least two reasons. First, as will be seen in what follows, the thesis of Christian influence plays a prominent role in Baring's analysis. Second, this thesis is bound to be deployed in debates on Derrida's relation to religious thought. I would, however, counsel caution in embracing Baring's claims here too quickly, given their ambiguity and the source material's relative inaccessibility.

Returning to Baring's narrative, the next stage discussed is Derrida's early study of Husserl. Chapter 3 provides the background with an engaging description of life at the ENS in the early 1950s. Regardless of an interest in Derrida, anyone working on postwar French philosophy would do well to read this chapter, such is the richness of Baring's account and the Ecole's importance in educating so many prominent French thinkers. Of direct relevance to Derrida, Baring argues that the Ecole's lack of formal constraints resulted in the increased power of social groups, and that the two groups that dominated were the communists and the Catholics. After a postwar intermingling, these groups came to be divided, affirming incompatible political and intellectual positions.

Baring's argument in this chapter is that this social configuration explains Derrida's choice of philosophical focus. Given his Jewish Algerian background, Derrida could never be one of the Catholics, since "they were comprised of people who went to Mass and joined together for prayer and religious service." Closer politically to the communists, Derrida was more susceptible to their influence, making it "no longer possible for him to make explicit reference to Christian existentialism." Further, in the move against Sartre mentioned above, the communists had started to take Husserl seriously, due largely to Tran Duc Thao's Marxist interpretation of the phenomenologist as a philosopher of science. As a result, "Derrida turned to the only one of his early sources regarded by the communists as ideologically acceptable: Husserl" (109). Baring's claim is thus that the philosopher who would occupy Derrida for the next ten years, forming the basis of all his work to come, was chosen primarily as the result of a complex negotiation of peer pressure.

Baring maintains, however, that Christian thought did not thereby disappear from Derrida's work. He presents initial evidence for this at the close of Chapter 3, arguing that Derrida's first two essays written at the Ecole use the language of phenomenology to express Kierkegaardian ideas. But it is in Chapter 4 that Baring develops this claim, arguing for the presence of Christian thinking in Derrida's 1954 dissertation The Problem of Genesis in Husserl's Phenomenology.

Baring first situates The Problem of Genesis by providing a more detailed account of the turn against Sartre in Husserl scholarship in the early 1950s. The general move was to concede the early Husserl to Sartre's idealist reading, but to argue that Husserl's later work, with its focus on history, constitutes a concrete alternative. Husserl was thus read as developing from an idealist beginning towards a quasi-materialist end. Baring argues that Derrida, while influenced by this interpretation, nonetheless breaks with it in his 1954 dissertation. Primarily, even as Derrida makes constant reference to "dialectic," what he means by this term is markedly different from the Marxists. It is not, as in the case of Thao, "the never-reached telos of Husserl's philosophical itinerary" (141) that would resolve the tensions in the phenomenologist's work. Rather, it marks a recognition of these tensions' incomprehensibility, and is present in different ways in all of Husserl's writings, early through late.

Christian thought enters the picture in Baring's claims that Derrida takes this understanding of dialectic from Paul Ricoeur, and that the primary tension tracked maps onto the poles of "problem" and "mystery." These latter terms come from Gabriel Marcel, and Baring notes several places in The Problem of Genesis in which the word "mysterious" appears. However, it is unclear from Baring's account whether in speaking thus Derrida did in fact have Marcel in mind. Baring acknowledges that Marcel is not named in the dissertation, and instead turns to notes for an essay Derrida wrote in 1954-55 on "The Notion of Problem." Here, Baring argues, "Derrida discussed the Marcelian distinction" (139), and he gives citations that certainly echo Marcel's understanding. But Marcel's name is absent from these citations, and Baring does not state if it appears in the rest of the text. This makes it difficult to determine just what kind of influence is here at work, if there is any at all. Be that as it may, on the basis of his analysis Baring draws the conclusion that even as The Problem of Genesis "began as a classic Normalien (and communist) project . . . in elaborating this project, Derrida returned to his earlier fascination with the mystical" (144).

The title of Chapter 5 -- "The God of Mathematics: Derrida and the Origin of Geometry" -- announces the continuation of the argument for the influence of Christian thought. This title is, however, somewhat misleading, for while focusing on Derrida's 1962 Introduction to his translation of Husserl's Origin of Geometry, Baring spends very little time showing the presence of Christian ideas in the Introduction itself. He begins by providing a very helpful account of French epistemology in the 1950s. We thus learn how the established philosophers of science -- Jean Cavaillès, Gaston Bachelard, and Jean Piaget -- were all critical of phenomenology's ability to account for scientific understanding, and how the younger generation -- primarily Suzanne Bachelard and Jean Ladrière -- defended Husserl against this charge. Baring places Derrida's text in the camp of the defenders, and, with a clear presentation of its main argument, convincingly shows it to be an important contribution to the epistemological debate.

This established, Baring then turns to Derrida's comparison of the indeterminacy of the Kantian idea in Husserl's system to God. In Derrida's Introduction the comparison is brief, discussed only for a page or so towards the very end, but Baring claims that this turn "is the most important in the book" (170). To make sense of it, he discusses three courses that Derrida taught at the Sorbonne in 1963. From the first, "Phenomenology, teleology, theology: the god of Husserl," Baring makes a number of citations in which Derrida analyses the relation between the ambivalent understanding of God in Husserl and the Kantian idea. The next two, "Can one say yes to finitude?" and "Ontology and theology," are shown to articulate a thinking of God based on the ontological difference much like that proposed in Henri Birault's reading of Heidegger. However, I was at a loss as to how these discussions illuminate Derrida's Introduction. In the page that, according to Baring, makes explicit the links, nothing suggests that God is anything more than an example Derrida  uses to illustrate his point about the Kantian idea. There is certainly nothing approaching "The God of Mathematics" named in the chapter's title. If in previous chapters I felt Baring's thesis on Derrida's relation to Christian thought to be at times a little strained, here it seemed to me to have reached its breaking point.

In any case, this thesis recedes as Baring moves to discuss the final period of Derrida's early development, from 1962 to 1967. This was an intensely productive time for Derrida, resulting in the publication of three imposing books -- Writing and Difference, Speech and Phenomena, and Of Grammatology. The density, range, and complex interrelation of these works make providing an account of them a formidable task. Rather than attempt to summarize their contents, Baring instead focuses on their development, continuing his strategy of highlighting the context in which Derrida's writings were produced and the debates to which they responded. In doing so, Baring succeeds quite brilliantly in making a genuine contribution to our understanding of these texts -- I can think of no account of this kind in the existing secondary literature.

Baring devotes a chapter to each text, beginning in Chapter 6 with Writing and Difference. His analysis here is guided by the fact that most of the essays in this book were published prior to 1967, with Derrida making revisions when collecting them into a single volume. By focusing on these revisions, Baring rather ingeniously tracks the ways in which Derrida's thought changes across the 1960s. Most notably, he demonstrates that when first published, some of the earlier essays contained a subtle privileging of speech over writing. This is erased in their republication in Writing and Difference, and the change comes in 1965 with Derrida's famous deconstruction of phonocentrism in "Writing Before the Letter," the essay which would become the first half of Of Grammatology. The shift in the status of writing goes hand in hand with the emergence of "différance" as key in Derrida's work. The word first appears in print in early 1965, in the essay "La Parole Soufflée," but Baring argues that there it doesn't quite fit the concept that it will later represent. The concept first appears in "Writing Before the Letter," but there the word is absent. How then, Baring asks, did Derrida come to match the word and concept? He answers this question through a revealing analysis of the context of Derrida's "Freud and the Scene of Writing," first delivered in 1966. After first providing a helpful summary of some of Lacan's main claims, Baring situates Derrida's essay in a debate on the nature of the unconscious between, on the one hand, Serge Leclaire and Jean Laplanche (Lacan's students), and André Green on the other. Presenting the details of this debate would take me too far afield, but Baring's ultimate claim is that the concept of différance allows Derrida to promote an alternative to the two positions, and that the "a" in the word signals it as a rival to the Lacanian objet (a).

Chapter 7 turns to Speech and Phenomena. Baring reads this book in light of the agrégation concours, that peculiarly French institution of written and oral exams ostensibly qualifying one to teach philosophy in the lycée, although it more properly functions to grant "a small elite of young philosophers access to university positions" (223). Derrida passed the agrégation on his second attempt in 1956, but important at this stage of the narrative is his move to the ENS in 1964 as an agrégé-répétiteur. Baring's thesis in this chapter is that the work Derrida performed in this position, where his main task was to prepare students taking the exams, was formative in the development of deconstruction. With extensive reference to the annual reports of the jury, a study guide of the time, and archival material such as Althusser's and Derrida's comments on student practice papers, Baring lays the groundwork for his argument by providing a detailed and lively description of both the exams and the training provided at the ENS. As with the earlier discussion of student life at the ENS, this section should be required reading for anyone studying postwar French philosophy, given the agrégation's role both in consolidating the canon that unifies the French philosophical community, and in exerting a strong influence on the way philosophy is written by its members.

In the second half of the chapter, Baring focuses on the agrégation's influence on Derrida's own work. He first discusses a mock essay that Derrida wrote as a guide for students in 1965-66 on Husserl's Formal and Transcendental Logic. Baring argues that this essay is exemplary as a response to the conflicting demands of the exams, with their dual demands of patient, pedagogical exposition coupled with individuating personal brilliance, and that it anticipates in broad strokes some of the claims and structure of Speech and Phenomena. Baring then turns to the latter text, providing a careful outline of its argument and showing that it too follows the principles governing the agrégation. Derrida's "broad sweep over the totality of Husserl's philosophy allowed him to provide a relatively standard and clear account of phenomenology . . . thus fulfill[ing] the pedagogical section of the agrégation" (250). This provides the basis from which emerges Derrida's interpretative intervention (his "personal brilliance"), showing the ways Husserl's system undermines its own claims. Taking this book as exemplary of Derrida's practice of reading as a whole, Baring thus concludes that the "agrégation's twin demands informed the very process of deconstruction" (256).

The ENS also figures prominently in Chapter 8, this time in an analysis of Of Grammatology. Reading this work as a response to Althusser's structuralism, Baring spends some time describing the behavior and work of the Althusserians at the Ecole. A particular highlight is the eye-opening discussion of notes from the "Groupe Spinoza" -- a secret group formed by Althusser in 1966 comprising "around fifteen present and past students, including Alain Badiou, Michel Tort, Etienne Balibar, and Pierre Machery" (273) -- revealing a world in which theory and politics are completely enmeshed, with intrigue at every turn. Baring argues that the group saw Derrida as an unreliable ally, and he quotes their plans to prevent his anti-humanism from passing to its opposite: 

"1. Through criticism, force Derrida to maximize his critique of phenomenology and his pseudo-rupture.

2. Short circuit him at the level of the status and nature of philosophical discourse . . .

3. Make metaphysics as such an object of analysis.

4. Strike at the level of literary theory . . .  " (276). 

More broadly, Baring outlines various aspects of Althusser's work in order to show its influence on the arguments of Of Grammatology. Here Baring argues that Derrida follows Althusser in criticizing Lévi-Strauss's nostalgia for a pure origin, and that Althusser's understanding of reading guides his engagement with Saussure. However, Derrida breaks decisively with his colleague by critiquing the possibility of an objective science, one free from all violence, and he retains a central reference to phenomenological experience. Thus despite some similarities, Baring's conclusion is that Of Grammatology "was in fact a radical critique of the Althusserian project" (292).

* * * * * * * * * * * *

I hope with this summary to have conveyed the depth and range of Baring's analysis. His archival work has enabled him to produce genuinely original interpretations of Derrida's early writings, and his detailed descriptions of the context of these writings constitute a rich portrait of the postwar French philosophical scene. Baring's clear and engaging style makes the book accessible to students, and, standing relatively independent, individual chapters or subsections would make excellent secondary reading in graduate and advanced undergraduate classes.

This is of course not to say that Baring's account is definitive. By his own admission, the book is necessarily selective, and one very significant omission is any discussion of Derrida's engagement with literature. Baring justifies this by asserting that Derrida's writings on literature "after all have been treated so well elsewhere" (13). But I would suggest that this is not at all the case, with no one having used archival research to provide a developmental account of this aspect of Derrida's work. And it's unclear that one can comprehensively discuss postwar French philosophy without a serious discussion of literary questions, given their importance for so many of the actors involved, the young Derrida included.

Further, while Baring's attention to the contexts of Derrida's writings is largely responsible for the originality of his interpretations, it does come at the expense of a unified vision. For the dominant image of the young Derrida that emerges is of a largely reactive thinker, albeit with an extremely impressive ability to respond rapidly and incisively to a constantly changing intellectual environment. In the final analysis, Baring says little about the strong consistency that is also present across Derrida's early work. This is in a sense understandable, since seeing Derrida as pursuing a single idea from the beginning is the standard interpretation that Baring contests. And Baring's thesis on the influence of Christian thought can be read as an attempt to give unity to the whole. But as I have suggested above, this thesis remains ambiguous, and it becomes less persuasive as the book progresses. Its virtual disappearance in the chapters dealing with Derrida's first three books also undermines its potential as a unifying thread. Lacking such unity, Baring's contextual readings are thus to my mind a little too one-sided to be the final word.

These are, however, minor complaints. All works are necessarily incomplete, and a book that engages so many previously unexplored sources is bound to leave some questions unanswered. Which is to say that in addition to unearthing so much unknown material, and thus contributing to ongoing interpretative debates, I hope that The Young Derrida and French Philosophy will also function as an example and an invitation. Derrida scholarship has much to benefit from future studies of this kind.