The Young Spinoza: A Metaphysician in the Making

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Yitzhak Y. Melamed (ed.), The Young Spinoza: A Metaphysician in the Making, Oxford University Press, 2015, 360pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199971664.

Reviewed by Justin Steinberg, Brooklyn College CUNY


It is difficult to imagine how Spinoza's legacy would be assessed if he had not written anything after 1663. His early writings -- generally taken to include the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect [TIE], Principles of Cartesian Philosophy [PPC] and its appendix (Metaphysical Thoughts [CM]), the Short Treatise [KV], and his early correspondence -- contain no shortage of arrestingly interesting claims. But, compared to the later works, the early works read like rough, and in some cases unfinished, preparatory studies.

Fortunately for us, Spinoza's work did not end in 1663. And his later writings, including his monumental work, the Ethics, remain extant. Since these later works are widely believed to contain the best statements of most of his views, we may wonder what the value is in studying the early works. The Young Spinoza goes some distance towards answering this question. Its essays help to chart the stages of Spinoza's philosophical development. And they do an impressive job of illustrating how studying the early works can illuminate one's understanding of the Ethics.

In order to determine what an earlier work can reveal about a later work, one must overcome an interpretative difficulty that arises when the differences between the works are subtle. One can, in these instances, take the differences in the early writings as supplements to one's understanding of some concept or line of argument in the later texts. But, of course, one can also take these same variations as evidence of the abandonment of some old way of thinking, in which case the differences in the early material tell us precisely how not to think about the later material. To put it crudely, the problem is that it is not always clear whether early differences should be added to or subtracted from the later iterations. Some of this volume's essays incline towards the additive approach, others toward the subtractive approach. And while the stances adopted seem sensible by and large, the general difficulty is inextirpable, and readers are bound to find instances in which they think an additive interpretation should have been subtractive or vice versa.

With this general methodological point out of the way, let me turn to the essays. Several home in on the place of beings of reason [entia rationis] in Spinoza's philosophy. John Carriero ("Spinoza, the Will, and the Ontology of Power") tries to make sense of Spinoza's claim in the KV that the will can't be a cause because it is a being of reason. Carriero's interpretation hinges on his reading of Spinoza's ontology of power: the will does not figure into the intrinsic structure of nature, which consists only of Nature, the invariances inscribed therein, and determinations of these invariances (i.e., particular things). Samuel Newlands ("Spinoza's Early Anti-Abstractionism") considers how beings of reason (like 'good' and 'evil') figure into Spinoza's larger critique of abstracta in the early works, which is notably severe even if the arguments deployed are not especially strong or original. Newlands rightly concludes that Spinoza thought that many moral, political, and theological disputes arise only because people take haphazardly and idiosyncratically formed abstractions to be real features of the world.

Karolina Hübner ("Spinoza on Negation, Mind-Dependence, and Reality of the Finite") sees a more constructive role for entia rationis. She claims that finite things can be understood for Spinoza not as determinations of invariances in Carriero's sense but rather as "well-founded entia rationis" (p. 235) -- allowing that we can have true knowledge of things that are known only abstractly. She advances this interpretation in response to the charge that Spinoza was an acosmist, or one who denies the reality of the world of finite things. While acknowledging that Spinoza did not conceive of himself as an acosmist, Hübner adroitly shows that several common responses to the charge of acosmism fail. Her original suggestion is that even if finite things are mere entia rationis, they are not thereby illusory. Consequently, the charge of acosmism is not apt.

John Morrison ("Truth in the Emendation") also attempts to overcome a general interpretative puzzle for Spinoza's philosophy. Specifically, he seeks to provide a Spinozistic definition of truth, which he thinks that Spinoza himself was on the cusp of supplying when the TIE comes to an abrupt halt. He surveys a range of interpretations of Spinoza's theory of truth, arguing that correspondence, coherence, and causal (internalist) accounts all fail to capture (or explain) at least one of the main features of true ideas. In their place he offers an original account, which he calls the "essentric interpretation."

Valtteri Viljanen ("Spinoza's Essentialism in the Short Treatise") shows that in the KV Spinoza was already committed to the view that all things have a definable essence and that "it never was a live option for him to think that reality might not have true structure, intelligibility, and stability" (p. 186). His instructive essay traces some of the notable similarities and differences between Spinoza's early and mature conception of essences, including the fact that Spinoza is somewhat more explicit about the individuality of essences in the KV than he is in the Essays. The interpretative problem that I noted in the opening is lurking here: does this lend support for the view that finite essences are individualized in the Ethics (as most seem to assume) or is the more ambiguous treatment of essences in the Ethics a sign that he had second thoughts about his earlier account? Viljanen is inclined towards the additive approach, but he judiciously abstains from making any bold pronouncements on this score.

Tad M. Schmaltz ("Spinoza on Eternity and Duration: The 1663 Connection") turns to the early writings to shed light on a perennial question for Spinoza scholars: how exactly are we to understand Spinoza's conception of eternity in the Ethics? Adopting Harry A. Wolfson's distinction between Platonic (atemporal) and Aristotelian (sempiternal) conceptions of eternity, Schmaltz looks to the early works to show that Spinoza was consistently a Platonist about God's eternity and an Aristotelian about the eternity of infinite modes. While Schmaltz is not the first to argue for this bifurcated view of eternity (for another recent version of this, see Yitzhak Y. Melamed, Spinoza's Metaphysics), his analysis is rather original and admirably compact. And while I harbor doubts about his final claim that the eternity of the human mind in Ethics V should also be understood as sempiternity, it is provocative and well-defended.

All of the above are fine examples of essays that generally emphasize the continuity between the treatment of some topic in the early writings and its treatment in the Ethics. But, as one would expect, many of the essays are more interested in the differences between the early and the late works. Yitzhak Y. Melamed ("A Glimpse into Spinoza's Metaphysical Laboratory") traces the many iterations and reversals of Spinoza's formulations of central ontological concepts, particularly substance and attribute. By setting these formulations forth in palimpsestic fashion, Melamed helps us to appreciate the metaphysics of the Ethics as the product of many years of rumination and 'experimentation.' Daniel Garber ("Spinoza's Cartesian Dualism in the Korte Verhandeling") identifies a strand of Dutch Cartesian influence on the KV, where Spinoza seems to indicate, à la Regius and Clauberg (pp. 130-1), that the mind can redirect the motion of bodies even if it cannot alter the total quantity of motion and rest in Nature. The interpretative problem arises yet again when we consider what the Dutch Cartesianism of the KV reveals about the later works. While it is quite natural to assume that the rejection of mind-body causal interaction in the Ethics is evidence of a sharp break with Cartesianism, the early Cartesian influence leads Garber to wonder whether "looking more carefully at Spinoza's mature writings might show traces of the same Dutch Cartesian heritage that we can find in the KV, hidden behind the austere geometrical surface of the Ethics" (p. 132).

Ursula Renz and Colin Marshall explore shifts in Spinoza's epistemology and theory of mind. Renz ("From the Passive to the Active Intellect") considers the transition from Spinoza's claim in the KV that the intellect is purely passive to the more "departmentalized" view of the Ethics, which allows for active "conceptions" that are not merely "perceptions." On Renz's reading, it is only in the Ethics, where he has worked out the intrinsically active character of ideas, that Spinoza advances a fully developed account of what it means to form an idea. Marshall's contribution ("Reason in the Short Treatise") tracks changes in Spinoza's conception of reason [ratio] from being the source of true, but not clear and distinct, ideas of things outside of us (KV) to being the source of adequate knowledge of common notions on the basis of which we may gain control over the passions (Ethics). Because the elevated status and increased potency of reason in the Ethics coincides with the internalization of the objects of rational thought, Marshall suggests that this shift can be seen as an expression of a general principle, which he calls, self-explanatorily, the "Proximity-Power Connection" (p. 140).

Michael LeBuffe ("Spinoza's Rules of Living") explores a tension that originates in Spinoza's early writings between his "dual commitments to intellectual elitism and good citizenship" (p. 93). LeBuffe claims that Spinoza resolves this tension in the later works by embracing a purer form of intellectualism marked by a cognitivist account of self-mastery and the abandonment of concessions to common understanding. His analysis is elegant and clear, even though I think he underestimates the persistence of Spinoza's commitment to democratic accommodation.

Edwin Curley and Mogens Lærke offer historically grounded reconstructions. Curley ("Spinoza's Lost Defense") speculates about the contents of Spinoza's apparently long lost (and possibly non-existent) response to his cherem. He reconstructs the material by looking at how material from the TTP could be marshaled in response to the charges, as recorded by two Spanish visitors in a deposition to the Inquisition. Lærke ("Leibniz on Spinoza's Tractatus de Intellectus Emendatione") attempts to explain what Leibniz was expecting when he complained that the TIE "breaks off exactly at the point where I expected the most from it." He draws on Leibniz's own marginal notes to show that he was hoping to discover more about the essence of thought or the definition of the intellect -- specifically, Leibniz hoped it would overcome ambiguities in his reading of the Ethics concerning whether or not God has an intellect and, if so, whether or not this intellect is a mode. Curley and Lærke are both distinguished authorities on their respective topics, and the depth of their learning is on full display here.

Alan Nelson ("The Problem of True Ideas in Spinoza's Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect") delivers the best case for the independent significance of the early works. He aims to shed light on the "method" of deducing truth from a "given idea" in the TIE, by proposing that we understand the method as similar to, and perhaps inspired by, the Cartesian model of deduction from the Regulae. According to this interpretation, the idea of God has conceptual pride of place in Spinoza's deductive method; however, any true idea can function as the starting point for his method since any true idea will necessarily be joined to the idea of God, which in turn confers unity on the whole deductive series.

The general quality of these essays is very high. Certainly this is true of those considered above. Still, not all of them are wholly successful. Filippo Mignini's "Fictio/Verziering[e] in Spinoza's Early Writings" is something of a retread of claims he has made more effectively elsewhere, and the argument is obscured by his dutiful tabulation of every use of the verb fingo and noun fictio across various works. Russ Leo's "Spinoza's Calvin" takes on an interesting topic (the extent to which Spinoza incorporates the structure and idiom of Calvin's Institutes) and is learned and informative; but its fascination with small details overburdens the work. Oded Schechter's "Temporalities and Kinds of Cognition in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, the Short Treatise, and the Ethics" is ambitious and at times insightful; however, it takes on far too much, leaving its most surprising claims in need of further support. Still, even the flawed essays are worth reading. Take Pina Totaro's piece ("The Young Spinoza and the Vatican Manuscript of Spinoza's Ethics") on the Vatican manuscript (of which she was one of the co-discoverers!). It may not build toward any particular claim, but it does include some eye-opening observations about the differences between the Vatican edition and the Opera Posthuma (OP) and Nagelate Schriften (NS) editions that will be of interest to scholars.

In terms of coverage, I was a little surprised to find that not a single one of the twenty essays seriously engages the rich treatment of the affects in KV II. But omissions like this can be forgiven since the overlap in topics that Melamed acknowledges in his introduction actually lends coherence to the volume. More regrettable is the lack of gender balance: only three of the twenty contributors are female. On the positive side, though, there is a good mix of senior and junior contributors, hailing from both North America and Europe and representing a range of interpretative approaches.

There is a lot of valuable material in this volume. Spinoza scholars will absolutely want to own a copy. And, given the reasonable price of the paperback edition, others with an interest in early modern philosophy might consider buying it. But it should be evident from this review that this is not a volume for those who are relatively new to Spinoza, as many of the essays are best understood in light of current research on the Ethics. Whether or not this collection fulfills Melamed's aspirations to "re-launch" a research program on Spinoza's early writings (p. 3), if this volume is any indication, future scholarship on the early writings is likely to be parasitic on the study of Spinoza's later works. Spinoza's legacy, as a matter of fact, rests squarely on the strength of his post-1663 works. Nevertheless, this volume amply attests to the ways that the early writings can fill out and enrich our understanding of this great philosopher.