Theism and Explanation

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Gregory Dawes, Theism and Explanation, Routledge, 2009, 211pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415997386.

Reviewed by Bradley Monton, University of Colorado at Boulder



Gregory Dawes’ Theism and Explanation is a competent, nuanced look at the nature and scope of theistic explanations. Dawes argues that theistic explanations can in principle be good explanations, but he also argues that they have to meet a high bar to count as good explanations. Dawes takes issue with extreme atheists, who hold that in principle theistic explanations cannot be successful — Dawes argues that in principle theistic explanations can be successful, and he lays out the conditions under which they would be. But Dawes also takes issue with extreme theists by maintaining a strong presumption against proposed theistic explanations. The result is an interesting and insightful look at what it takes to be a successful theistic explanation.

In outline, the discussion of the book runs as follows. Chapter 1 takes up the arguments of those who object to theistic explanations. Chapter 2 talks in general about the nature of explanation, and Chapter 3 talks about what theistic explanations are. Chapter 4 talks about what theistic explanations are meant to explain. Chapter 5 endorses a key condition — the optimality condition — which constrains God’s behavior: whatever God wills, he will choose the most optimal way of achieving it. Chapter 6 talks about Inference to the Best Explanation, with a strange focus on Swinburne’s inductive reasoning for the existence of God. Finally, Chapter 7 lays out six explanatory virtues, and discusses what it would take for a theistic explanation to satisfy these virtues. Dawes concludes that we always have reason to prefer natural explanations, and if no natural explanations are at hand, we would always be justified in seeking one (p. 142). Also, there is an appendix that defends the viability of intentional explanations — explanations that appeal to the intentions of an agent.

There are lots of footnotes to the literature, but in the main body of the text Dawes mostly lays out his own positions. Nevertheless in Chapter 1 Dawes does present a few of the extreme atheists’ views. Dawes talks about “in principle objections” to theistic explanations — objections that hold that theistic explanations are in principle unsuccessful. For example, Robert Pennock holds that all theistic explanations are “immune from disconfirmation” since they “give no guidance about what does or does not follow from their supernatural components” (p. 15). Dawes holds that Pennock is wrong: while it’s true that some proposed theistic explanations are unfalsifiable, a theistic explanation can be formulated in a detailed and careful way that allows for falsification. In my opinion, Dawes is clearly right about this. But he doesn’t just give the quick refutation and move on. Instead, he sets himself a more challenging task: beginning with Chapter 2, he starts from scratch, taking up the very idea of a theistic explanation, examining its implications, and building up to a discussion of what it would take for theistic explanations to be successful. Then in Chapter 5 he comes back to in principle objections to theistic explanations, and explains why such objections fail.

Dawes’ most insightful arguments occur in Chapter 5. Here Dawes considers two main forms of sceptical objections to the hypothesis that, in principle, a proposed theistic explanation could be a successful one. The first objection Dawes considers is “theological scepticism” — that God is an agent so different from the agents with which we’re familiar that we can’t make any predictions about his behavior. The second objection Dawes considers is “modal scepticism” — that we may know the nature of God, but we don’t know the options available to him, and hence can’t make judgements about what God would do.

With regard to theological scepticism, Dawes’ first key response is that “a proposed theistic explanation is constrained by the presumption of rationality upon which all intentional explanations rely” (p. 83). Dawes holds that theistic explanations are a type of intentional explanation, and he argues that intentional explanations in general are legitimate. One presumption behind intentional explanations is that “the agent will act rationally in order to attain her intended goal” (p. 84). Dawes recognizes that this presumption of rationality is defeasible, but in the case of God it is not defeated. We can assume that God, if he exists, does act rationally, and this puts a constraint on God’s actions — his actions must be in accord with his beliefs and desires and goals.

But how do we know what God’s beliefs and desires and goals are? Dawes argues that “we are perfectly at liberty to make such assumptions and see what follows from them” (p. 84). While this is true, there is a looming problem here. For whatever occurs, one can postulate that the sort of God exists who would want that to occur. Thus, for whatever occurs, some potential theistic explanations will be ruled out, but there will always be some potential theistic explanations that are compatible with what happened.

Dawes argues against this, saying that

there are possible states of affairs which any proposed theistic explanation must exclude; this would be true even of a bare-bones proposed explanation of the form … (1) God wants it to be the case that a. (2) What God wants to be the case is the case. (3) Therefore a (pp. 43-4).

Specifically, Dawes says: “If the God in question is omnipotent and morally perfect, we would not expect him to bring about, for instance, states of gratuitous suffering” (p. 44). But there are two problems here. First, the assumptions of omnipotence and moral perfection are controversial — not everyone thinks that God has these attributes, and hence, when one is considering the class of all possible theistic explanations, it seems reasonable to include theistic explanations that don’t make these assumptions. The second problem with Dawes’ line of reasoning is that some standard solutions to the problem of evil argue that God’s perfection is compatible with there being gratuitous suffering in the world (or at least, suffering that for us is indistinguishable from gratuitous suffering). For example, Plantinga’s transworld depravity thesis holds that it’s possible that it’s not within God’s power to actualize a world where the agents that God has created don’t sin. It would be reasonable to hold, then, that the price for creating these free agents is that the agents will produce gratuitous suffering. I conclude that Dawes’ argument that there are possible states of affairs which any proposed theistic explanation must exclude is problematic.

Let’s step back. Above we considered Pennock’s false view: any state of affairs is compatible with any theistic explanation. Dawes is putting a more nuanced view on the table: all states of affairs rule out some theistic explanations, and some states of affairs rule out all theistic explanations. I’ve argued that Dawes’ view is false too. What’s true, I maintain, is that any state of affairs is compatible with some but not all theistic explanations. But if my view is right, it’s not damning to Dawes’ project (unlike, for example, if Pennock’s view were right). For whatever occurs, we can ask the question of which theistic explanations fit with what occurs, and we can make independent evaluations of the plausibility of such explanations.

What, according to Dawes, does it take for a theistic explanation to fit with what occurs? I’ve already given part of the answer — the explanation must assume that God is acting rationally. Dawes holds that, from this rationality principle, the optimality condition follows, and he holds that this condition is the most important constraint on a proposed theistic explanation (p. 85).

The optimality condition holds that God, being rational, would use the best way to achieve his goal or intention. The main example Dawes uses to explicate the optimality condition is Gould’s “panda’s thumb” example — Gould holds that if God had created the panda, the thumb that pandas use to strip bamboo would have had a more efficient design. Dawes holds that, in principle, a suboptimality argument like this one is a good argument. But he points out that optimality is optimality “in relation to a specified divine purpose”, and it is up to us to hypothesize what that purpose is. Gould implicitly assumes that God’s purpose is to create the perfect panda, or at least a panda that has a maximally efficient way of stripping bamboo, but Dawes points out that this need not be God’s actual purpose.

One objection Dawes considers to the optimality condition is the modal sceptical one — that we don’t know the options available to God, and hence we can’t make judgements about what God would do. One version of this objection would hold that, for any proposed theistic explanation of some event, we may think that we can make informed judgements about whether God’s goal is being optimally achieved with the posited divine intervention, but in fact we are too epistemically limited to be able to do so.

Dawes, to an extent, endorses this objection. Because of the optimality condition, he holds that "We are warranted in regarding a theistic hypothesis as a potential explanation of some state of affairs only if we cannot conceive of any better way in which the posited divine goal could have been attained" (p. 98-99). But Dawes suggests that we should only have a modest degree of confidence in our judgements about how divine goals can be obtained. As a result, he maintains that “we can never be confident that any particular theistic hypothesis has explanatory force” (p. 99).

Dawes admits that the optimality condition “sets the bar very high” (p. 115). In Chapter 7, he assumes that the theist has met this condition, and goes on to discuss what it would take for a theistic explanation to be the best explanation of some observable fact. Specifically, he discusses how theistic explanations can be assessed against a list of six explanatory virtues: testability, consistency with background knowledge, previous explanatory success of the type of hypothesis under consideration, simplicity, ontological economy, and informativeness. The discussion here moves somewhat fast: Dawes doesn’t have the space to deal with the vast literature in the philosophy of science on explanation in general, and on the extent to which these purported virtues should really count as virtues — not to mention the whole issue of whether it’s legitimate to infer that the best explanation is the true one. Nevertheless, I found Dawes’ discussion to be informative.

With regard to testability, Dawes holds explanations in general can sometimes be corroborated by facts that are already known, and the same holds for theistic explanations. Dawes is right about this, but the interesting part of his discussion comes when he takes up an argument of Elliott Sober’s. Sober holds that hypotheses with no competitors cannot be tested, and that at least some theistic explanations are like this. Dawes convincingly argues that Sober is mistaken: in fact, a failure to pass independent tests will count against an explanation, regardless of whether an explanation has competitors.

With regard to consistency with background knowledge, Dawes maintains that theistic explanations score poorly when measured against this explanatory virtue. The reason they do so, he says, is that “the agent they posit is so dissimilar to any other with which we are familiar” (p. 126). But I wonder if Dawes has overly high standards here. A theistic explanation, recall, isn’t just a general appeal to God; it’s a specific account of God’s goals and intentions, and how they fit with the possible actions open to God. It seems open to theists to take as part of their background knowledge the bare claim that God exists. Perhaps Dawes would say that, even assuming God exists, the claim that God exists has to be excluded from background knowledge when one is giving a theistic explanation. Proponents of a theistic explanation, however, could still include the existence of other supernatural beings, like angels, in their background knowledge. As a result, when God is posited as an agent, that agent won’t look so dissimilar to other agents with which the theist is purportedly familiar.

With regard to the explanatory virtue that the type of hypothesis under consideration should have previous explanatory success, Dawes again says that theistic explanations fare poorly, and on this point I agree with him. Naturalistic explanations belong to a successful research tradition, that of giving scientific explanations for phenomena. Dawes says that belonging to such a successful research tradition “is a virtue that proposed theistic explanations clearly lack” (p. 132).

With regard to the virtue of simplicity, Dawes discusses the views of a few people, but doesn’t offer any definitive position of his own. He seems to settle on the answer that it is difficult to assess how proposed theistic explanations rate on this desiderata.

With regard to ontological economy, Dawes holds that this should be viewed as the Ockham-razor-style position of ontological type-economy: we should not posit new kinds of entities without sufficient reason. He suggests that theistic explanations are not ontologically economical, because they posit a new type of entity. Dawes says that “we could conceivably have sufficient reason to accept a theistic hypothesis, despite its lack of ontological economy”, but if we have an alternative more economical hypothesis, we should prefer it, and if we do not have one, “we would have good reason to seek it” (p. 137).

Finally, Dawes takes up the explanatory virtue of informativeness. Dawes cashes this out as the idea that we should prefer a hypothesis that enables us to deduce the precise details of the effect. Dawes points out that theistic explanations fail to make quantitative predictions, but he suggests that this is not a fatal objection, since everyday intentional explanations are in the same boat. He does point out that there is a key difference between everyday intentional explanations and theistic explanations though — everyday intentional explanations involve agents with whom we’re familiar, while the posited divine agent is mysterious. He says that “since we do not know the full range of divine options, we cannot know with any degree of confidence how God would or would not act, in order to achieve his goals” (p. 141). Dawes concludes that theistic explanations won’t fare well on the desideratum of informativeness.

One interesting aspect to this book is that Dawes never tells us whether he is a theist or an atheist. I take it that he is a theist, but I did wonder whether that was really the case when I saw how high he was setting the bar: theistic explanations must fulfill the optimality condition to even be in the running, and they don’t fare well when measured up against some of the six explanatory virtues under consideration. It’s unfair of me to think this way though — I shouldn’t just assume that a theistic philosopher will assess the virtues of theistic explanations in a different way than an atheistic philosopher would. Instead, my default presumption should be that a good philosopher like Dawes will make fair-minded, intelligent assessments of how theistic explanations fare, regardless of his personal beliefs about whether or not there is a God. The intellectual climate around theistic explanations, especially as relating to theistic explanations for scientific phenomena, has been somewhat poisoned by all the rhetoric regarding intelligent design. While Dawes talks about intelligent design here and there in his book, he never does so in an emotive, unfair way. It’s a virtue of this book that one comes away thinking that Dawes is fair-minded and intelligent — and that this assessment will hold regardless of whether one thinks that Dawes believes in God.