Themes from Brentano

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Denis Fisette and Guillaume Fréchette, Themes from Brentano, Rodopi 2013, 530pp., $148.50 (hbk), ISBN 9789042037427.

Reviewed by Claudio Majolino, Université de Lille III


Brentano ist eine historische Größe
-- was keinesfalls heißt ein für allemal erledigt

Edmund Husserl

In the early Seventies, Michel Foucault famously conjectured that one day the century would turn out to have been Deleuzian.[1] To be sure, what he actually meant by such an enigmatic claim is far from clear. As it has been convincingly argued,[2] his idea was probably not to predict the advent of a Deleuzian "century" but simply to suggest that, at some point, Deleuze's philosophy would become "secular", i.e., no longer limited to highly specialized and almost religious philosophical circles of "Deleuzians". Its themes would attain a wide non-philosophical audience, they would become common currency even among laypeople, and consequently run the risk of being trivialized.

Be that as it may, what Foucault couldn't possibly have imagined in 1970 is that, some forty years later, various logicians, metaphysicians, philosophers of mind, language and values would try to turn his prediction, literally, upside-down. Deleuze was in fact a fine -- although atypical -- constructivist and anti-realist; a pragmatist rather than a descriptivist; he praised the Stoics over Aristotle, Scotus over Aquinas, and Hume over Descartes. Not to mention his fondness for Nietzsche. All authors and positions that Brentano's "theory of the four phases" explicitly downgraded[3] as historical forms of philosophical decadence or downfall (VerfallAbsteigung).[4] In sum, even if one were not ready to follow Barry Smith's and Balász M. Mezei's provocative and somewhat half-baked "application" of Brentano's theory to the history of contemporary philosophy,[5] one thing would nevertheless remain certain: a "Deleuzian century" would definitively look like the opposite of a "Brentanian century".

Though its main focus is not to revive the never-ending Analytic-Continental affair, Themes from Brentano (henceforth TFB) can be seen as a consistent way to ask whether our century is not, at least to some extent, already "Brentanian".

* * * * *

Now, a brief glance at the actual state of research seems to suggest that the answer is likely to be negative.To begin with, at least at the moment, we do not even have a complete edition of Brentano's papers "which complies with modern text-critical standards. Therefore we still do not know what Brentano has really written" (370). Secondly, as pointed out by Guillaume Fréchette in his introductory essay, although Brentano's name is certainly not unknown in many philosophical circles, "there seems to be no consensus on his impact on the philosophy of his time, and, more generally, on 20th century philosophy," nor on the "nature of this impact" (9). Finally, if one should describe the explicit presence of Brentano in recent philosophical discussions, the word "marginalization" would definitively be in order. A "marginalization" -- to put it in Fréchette's terms – "from both the analytic and continental philosophy of the 1950s, as a mere 'forerunner of the phenomenological movement', a 'precursor of Husserl', or, as Ryle calls him in relation with his philosophical offspring, the 'disgusted grandfather of phenomenology'" (14). Besides, didn't Quine call one of the most illustrious philosophical victims of his fearsome thesis of the indeterminacy of translation, "the Brentano thesis"? Didn't Word and Object definitively show what Quine dubs "the baselessness of intentional idioms and the emptiness of a science of intention," such as the one championed by Brentano (91-2)?

If the above is true, then advocating a "Brentanian century" while Brentano's works are still widely unpublished (or published in philologically inaccurate editions (384)), his legacy disputed and his importance either lowered by Quine's authority or superseded by Husserl's legacy clearly appears unsound. Yet another possible answer lurks in the clever title of this book, a title whose sense is noticeably ambiguous.

* * * * *

The editors are prominent scholars who have each widely published on Brentano. Being familiar with the French literature on the topic, I cannot help mentioning their impressive anthology A l'école de Brentano,[6] a well-conceived collection of essays by Husserl, Stumpf, Ehrenfels, Meinong, Twardowski, and Marty translated into French and introduced by an extensive essay ("Le legs de Brentano"), which, in this reviewer's opinion, is one of the most complete and historically accurate reconstructions of the Brentano school to the date.

So, at least to some extent, TFB pursues further the editors' long-term project of charting both historically and theoretically the territory of the Brentanoschule. And if we take the word "theme" in a narrow sense, the book appears as a helpful attempt to explore some of the main topics discussed by Brentano and his more or less recent heirs.

Of the seventeen texts grouped in this volume, some are Brentano's own, introduced, edited and translated into English[7]; six are new interpretations of Brentano's claims and/or careful readings of his works and their sources[8]; three extend the historical scope of the book to include a consideration of Brentano's students such as Marty and Stumpf[9]; four are Brentano-inspired original accounts of consciousness and intentionality[10]; and one is an historically informed and extremely detailed article on the vicissitudes of Brentano's unpublished materials[11].

If compared with A l'école de Brentano, this volume can thus be taken as an effort to show how Brentano's "themes" were not only "influential" (a term the editors are fond of, see: 9-15 and passim) in the closer circle of his students, but also have an interesting "long-term impact" in recent scholarship and research.

* * * * *

But there is definitively more.

Even if the actual legacy of "Brentano the teacher" (39) is certainly one of the main subjects of TFB, the contributions gathered in this volume also suggest -- as the ambiguity of the title implicitly points out -- that despite the above mentioned limits of Brentano's reception, one can still regard Brentano's "themes" as nothing but the main themes of the contemporary philosophical debate. One should also probably add that such a claim is limited to the contemporary analytical debate -- but I will leave this point aside for the moment.

Consciousness and self-awareness; intentionality, taken both mentally and linguistically; mereology, general metaphysics and ontology applied to mind, values and feelings[12]-- these are, at the same time, themes of Brentano (i.e., themes thoroughly explored by Brentano himself and explicitly put at the heart of his own reflection) and leading themes of contemporary philosophy. Themes that are currently discussed in a form established by and inherited from Brentano.

Put emphatically, one could say that in the same broad sense in which the "theme" of the "one and the many" is said to be Platonic, that of the "manifold meanings of being" Aristotelian, or that of the "analogy of being" Thomistic, themes like "the mark of the mental" or even the so-called and nowadays quite popular "hard problem of consciousness" (see 17)[13] -- can all be safely dubbed as Brentanian. And this obviously holds not because authors like Searle or Chalmers were (directly or indirectly) "influenced" by Brentano or one of his Schulern or Enkelschulern. It is rather because their account of "intentionality" (qua "mark of the mental") and "consciousness" (qua "subjective component of experience") conceptually presupposes a turning point in recent history, i.e., the way in which Brentano renewed such themes and -- through a certain amount of historical mediations -- made them available in the form under which they are currently discussed.

An argument can thus be made that a whole host of theories of consciousness in recent analytic philosophy of mind tackle "intentionality" or "consciousness" in a Brentanian fashion, even though their proponents are unaware of the "secularization" undergone by such "themes from Brentano" (or, more precisely, unaware of the trivialization[14] of such "themes", historically and conceptually recast by Brentano).

* * * * *

Of course, intentio is a quite old medieval concept. And there is certainly a story to be told about an "intentional claim" ("all/some of our mental states are of or aboutsomething") already at work in Aristotle's De Anima. And yes, there is unquestionably a "self-awareness claim" ("presentations are self-presentations") in Descartes'sMeditations. Not to mention Brentano's "metaphysical claim" (resting on his mereology), whose deep roots could be found in Plato's Parmenides and Theaetetus. Let us grant all these points. Even so, it is still possible to quite consistently maintain that: (1) without Brentano's iconic formulations in the Psychology (where the intentional theme explicitly appears as a "Charakterisierung der psychische Phänomene")[15] and their subsequent migration in the Anglo-American idiom, the apparently innocuous and almost idiomatic talk of "intentionality as the mark of the mental" would simply be inconceivable; (2) it would be as inconceivable as the existence of analytic-bent historians of philosophy asking whether and to what extent Aristotle or Parmenides had a "theory of intentionality" or "a higher-order account of consciousness"[16] using Brentano-like accounts of intentionality and consciousness as guiding threads; (3) neither in Aristotle's nor in Descartes' nor in Plato's terms are "themes" such as intentionality, consciousness or mereology discussed in contemporary literature -- if discussed at all, they rather appear as embedded into to a "network of questions and answers"[17] that can be traced back to Brentano and his circle.

In sum, if we take again intentionality as a paradigmatic case, one can argue that it is because of the institution, covert transmission and subsequent transformation of Brentano's intentional theme that: (i) contemporary analytic philosophy of mind can safely ask whether all mental acts are intentional, if the intentional mediation of mental objects is required, if feelings and desires are truly intentional, etc.; (ii) analytic historians of philosophy can consistently question whether the Pre-Socratics or the Stoics actually had an account of intentionality, described as "the feature of beliefs, desires, and other mental states, in virtue of which they are of or about something".[18]

In order to stress this point, it may be useful to recall that Brentano's intentional framework is far from being the only one available. For at least another variation on the "intentional theme" can be observed in contemporary phenomenology-inspired continental philosophy. In fact, if "intentionality" certainly plays a crucial role in authors such as Lévinas, Sartre, Patočka or Merleau-Ponty, it is not qua "mark of the mental" or, to phrase it in Searle's terms, as "that property of many mental states and events by which they are directed at or about or of objects and states of affairs in the world". [19] For all these authors share the view that "intentional directedness" is neither a distinctive mark nor a defining property of certain entities called "mental states". It is rather, to say it briefly, a feature of human existence in its factual finitude and whose ratio essendi, as the young Heidegger puts it, is called "transcendence"[20] -- a claim that has hardly a place in a Brentanian mindset.

Such a shift from the "object-directedness of mental states" to "transcendence of human existence" (or "Dasein", or "pour-soi", etc.) identifies two quite different intentional "themes", each of which raises its own very specific set of problems, questions and answers; each fostering different lines of historical reconstruction and appropriation of Aristotle, Plato or the Pre-Socratics. And if we agreed to dub the former variation on the intentional theme as "Brentanian", we should definitively have to qualify the latter (intentionality qua figure of transcendence) as a "theme from Heidegger".

* * * * *  

But let us put Heidegger aside.

If "themes from Brentano" in this second sense means themes (a) whose specific form has been instituted by Brentano, (b) that pervade the contemporary philosophical debate exactly in such form and (c) that lead to certain questions/answers precisely in virtue of such form, the idea of an ongoing "Brentanian century" has certainly more chances to seem less counter-intuitive.

In light of this fact, TFB now appears not just as the umpteenth collection of papers devoted to a single author, but as a quite interesting challenge to a somewhat paradoxical situation. The paradox can be described as follows: while Brentano's themes are at present both "secularized" and appear everywhere, Brentano himself is still hard to find. Or, put differently, in our "Brentanian century" the actual Brentano is either trivialized or still widely unknown. As a result, uncovering Brentano's actual thought and thematizing the nature of its contribution is no longer a simple scholarly affair. It is also, and more importantly, an archeological inquiry, as it were, into the deep conceptual network of contemporary analytic philosophy of mind and metaphysics.

Under this new heading, TFB performs two philosophical operations: (1) clarifying Brentano's actual themes; (2) revisiting Brentano's themes in light of their contemporary (acknowledged or unacknowledged) legacy.

(1) According to the first operation, one has to "Give to Brentano what Belongs to Brentano", i.e., recognize where his original contributions actually lie. This can be done in three different ways: (1.1) by presenting and commenting on Brentano's texts; (1.2) by situating Brentano in the long-term context of the history of philosophy; (1.3) by contrasting his positions with those defended by his own students.

(1.1) Wilhelm Baumgartner's essay is a good example of the first approach. For those who are still at pains in recognizing the pervasiveness of mereology as an eminent "theme from Brentano", his article, although not truly original,[21] is an excellent way to recognize the multiple ways in which part-whole relations appear in fields as different as the history of philosophy (227-231), ontology (231-232), metaphysics (233-236) and psychology (236-242).

But this first group of texts includes not only the "secularized" themes already tacitly at work in current discussions, but also the whole complex context to which they belong, a context embracing themes that have not (yet?) passed into the contemporary analytical mainstream. Among the latter, one finds, for instance, a reflection on God and the Good, and the view that every simultaneously perceived mental phenomena belong to one unity of consciousness.

This second theme is remarkably surveyed, both historically and conceptually, in Mark Textor's article. As Textor puts it,

The thesis that intentionality is the mark of the mental was and still is central to discussions in the philosophy of mind. By contrast, the view that only mental phenomena are real and that we are infallible about them has not had many supporters. Finally, Brentano's thesis that a particular kind of unity is a mark of the mental has been neglected in discussions. (69)

As for the first theme, it is explored in Susan Gabriel's article. Focused on the tight bond between Brentano's psychology, ontology and theodicy, Gabriel ends up claiming that

in the spirit of Brentano's psychology, ethics and later ontology . . . one way to frame the problem of evil is to ask the question whether there exists anything the existence of which ought never to have been preferred to its non-existence by a supposed infinitely perfect God. (268)

(1.2) The theme of the specificity of Brentano's approach is further developed in Arkadiusz Chrudzimski's and Werner Sauer's articles, with respect to Aristotle and the Scholastic Tradition.

Chrudzimski's paper has the merit of showing all over again that, at least insofar as his account of intentionality is concerned, "what Brentano in fact took from Aristotle was rather his way of doing philosophy and certain isolated ideas, but certainly not theories in their entirety" (121).[22] What appears as most interesting here is precisely the backlash of the distinction between themes-of and themes-from suggested above. The author deliberately looks for Aristotle's "ontology of intentionality" in order to compare it with Brentano's (125-28). Accordingly, he uses a "theme from Brentano" ("ontology of intentionality") in order to (i) acknowledge its presence in Aristotle and (ii) track some of the main historical mediations and conceptual transformations that made a "theme of Brentano" out of it (135-36). As for Sauer's contribution, it is praiseworthy for a different reason. In fact, Sauer delivers a philologically accurate survey of Brentano's early account of Aristotle's notion of òn hôs alêthés in his dissertation On the Manifold Meanings of Being in Aristotle. Unlike Chrudzimski, Sauer does not start from a contemporary point of view, but rather pursues the historical from the start. As a result, he is able to uncover originally a very specific point in which Brentano (following Aquinas and yet being unfaithful to him) identifies the veridical "is" of what Met. D 7 describes as "being as the true", with the copulative "is" of the affirmative form "S is P" (224). This is important, for such an early account brings a whole set of very specific problems whose presence will shape ex negativo Brentano's more mature ideogenetic theory of judgment (225). And since no specific article in TFB is devoted to the topic, one might be tempted to suggest that if Brentano's theory of judgment cannot be counted as a "theme from Brentano",[23] some reasons for such an absence are likely to be found in its complex philosophical origin, as it is highlighted by Sauer.

(1.3) But the specific resources of Brentano's conceptuality can also be stressed by means of its contrast with the positions of some of his students, as in the sketch of a "theory of musical phenomena and of sense perception" (354) described by Riccardo Martinelli through the study of Brentano's different critiques of Stumpf. Beyond the useful reconstruction of the Brentano/Stumpf divide about tonal fusion, Martinelli's article shows how sense and tonal perception can be differently approached within a Brentanian framework. This has the merit of indicating (on the basis of a very specific and technical debate) the multiple resources of Brentanian conceptuality.

To some extent, the same holds for the quite accurate piece by Fisette, where Stumpf's theory of emotions is presented as "an attempt to reconcile Brentano's hedonic intentionalism with James' sensualism" (272). On a specialized level, the author tackles the technical issue of algedonic sensations in their relation to emotions, and convincingly re-interprets Stumpf's theory in a non-causal and mereological way (302). But, on a more general level, the actual value of this contribution lies in the fact that Fisette shows how a broadly Brentanian framework can be implemented, contaminated and enriched from within, to include elements belonging to different lines of inquiry. This can be powerfully illustrated by Stumpf's account of feelings as "emotions cum fundamentum in sensory feelings" (297), taking seriously James' emphasis on the role of bodily feelings (287-9).

We should finally mention Laurent Cesalli's extremely rigorous essay on Marty's theory of meaning. Cesalli successfully shows how a "Brentanian" philosophy of language like "Marty's intentionalist approach to language and, thus, to semantics" (141), ends up being able to address consistently major issues like "what is meaning?" (143) or how human communication is possible.

(2) As for the second operation -- "revisiting Brentano" -- it can also take two different forms: (2.1) explaining contemporary concepts whose "origin" is Brentanian through Brentano's own concepts; (2.2.) explaining Brentano's own concepts through contemporary concepts. Or, put differently, one can "renew" the current discussion on consciousness and intentionality thanks to Brentano's actual accounts of consciousness and intentionality; or "review and correct" Brentano's accounts in light of more recent accounts. Needless to say, the two approaches are not mutually exclusive. And it has to be stressed that they are both quite risky to perform. For the manipulation of Brentanian concepts in order to test their proficiency is not without the danger of producing a kind of conceptual "bricolage" with uncontrolled contaminations of terms, problems and arguments.

(2.1) This risk is elegantly avoided by Uriah Kriegel, in an article discussing the viability of the Brentanian theory of consciousness (as a self-representational theory of consciousness) with regard to current debates on qualia and phenomenal consciousness (19), while re-injecting a revisited Brentano within the Brentano-informed and yet Brentano-unaware contemporary discussion. The author discusses Brentano's account of consciousness in terms of self-directed intentionality, supplements it with original arguments, and suggests a different take on Brentano's legacy as well. The complexity of the attempt does not allow for further details in the limited space allowed here. However, the most remarkable aspect of Kriegel's essay is that once having been rephrased in his type-token terms, "Brentano's thesis" (no presentation without self-presentation) reads as follows: "every token representation-of must betoken a representation type some tokens of which (perhaps paradigmatic ones) are both representations-of and representations-to" (27) or, more economically, "every paradigmatic token of representation-of is also a representation-to" (27n3).[24] Such a reformulation is a successful way to look beyond Brentano to find the tools by means of which Brentano's own conceptuality can explicitly be made fruitful in a debate that Brentano's "secularized" themes have contributed to shape but not yet to improve.

On the crest of the same wave, one should also mention Olivier Massin's original and partly critical appropriation of Brentano's "view that all pleasures, including bodily pleasures, are directed towards objects" (307). Again, Massin's aim is neither to present nor to defend Brentano's views. It is rather to address the very issue of hedonic intentionalism by analyzing Brentano's position and disentangling his "significant proposals" from "the more disputable ones". Among the former, Massin reckons (i) the inconsistency of purely reflexive feelings, (ii) the idea that mental and bodily pleasures share some essential property and (iii) that bodily pleasures are directed toward algedonic qualities. As for the points to reject, he singles out (iv) Brentano's views on internal perception as well as "his later view that all sensory pleasures are directed towards sensory acts" (335).

(2.2) I suspect that the second way of confronting "themes-of" and "themes-from" by "reinterpreting" or "revisiting" Brentano's views is probably the most difficult to follow.

Of the three essays devoted to such a task only Fréchette's seems to bring the point home. To begin with, Fréchette is always very careful,[25] and he explicitly indicates the moments where his argument shifts from a "reconstruction" of Brentano's intentional claims to the elaboration of an "alternative view that . . . is able to preserve important insights from Brentano's Psychology while providing an answer to the objections made to him by his students" (114). But where the paper actually moves forward is, on my view, where Fréchette exposes the misconstructions at the basis of the "analytic" transformation of Brentano's claim by Chisholm and his heirs (91-100). Indeed, one could describe this paper's achievement as the careful depiction of one the prices that Brentano's doctrine of intentionality had to pay to become successfully "secularized".

On the contrary, Johannes L. Brandl's and Matjaž Portč's readings of Brentano seem, in my view, less convincing. Brandl's article is an attempt to "revisit" Brentano's distinction between "innere Wahrnehmung" and "innere Beobachtung" in terms of "degrees" of self-awareness (55-56). Brandl presents his essay as a "charitable way of 'updating' [Brentano's] theory without doing damage to it" (45), and not unlike Fréchette, he sprinkles his arguments with extensive caveats[26]. However, I fear that the suggested "update" does more damage to Brentano than Brandl thinks, for it ends up interpreting away a core distinction that, although certainly problematic, plays a pivotal role in Brentano's epistemology and metaphysics. Brandl suggests in fact that "the distinction between inner perception and inner observation [is] a merely gradual difference in how well we perceive our own mental states" (53), and he mixes up texts of different periods to make his point. However (a) one might be tempted to recall that since the actual distinction at stake is also epistemic (evident/non evident; infallible/fallible),[27] the author fails to explain why an "indistinct awareness of oneself" should be called "evident", as Brentano unmistakably does, while the "more distinct one" should be dubbed as "non-evident" and even "doubtful". (b) On the other hand, the "innere Wahrnehmung" is better described, in Brentanian terms, as an existential judgment about the actual existence of a mental act, not something akin to a simple perception without attention (52).[28] (c) Moreover, one could also find misleading that, in the whole paper, "inner perception" and "inner observation" are indistinctly referred to as "mental faculties" (42, 51, 52).[29]

On a different note, an article I had trouble assessing in its full implications is Potrč's. Here, too, the author avows, "no meticulous textual adequacy is intended" in his historical and textual reconstructions (171). He also clearly admits that his attempt, or at least the first part of it, "may . . . be read as an argumentative reconstruction of Brentano's view on the phenomenology of intentionality" (166). However, while the general topic might somehow be clear, the continuous contaminations of themes (phenomenology, intentionality), issues (inseparatism, narrowness, possible worlds, Russell's acquaintance), concepts of Brentano, from Brentano, and sometimes ideas clearly from above (like the talk of "transglobal world" needed for intentionality (177)), often make the line of thought not as clear as it might have been. Besides, straightforward questions such as "was Brentano a separatist or an inseparatist?" (see 179-181) are precisely the kind of mainstream analytic questions that a careful reading of TFB as a whole might end up exposing as ill-formulated.

* * * * *

To conclude, let me simply suggest that the clear value of TFB is not only to emphasize the historical value and philosophical vitality of Brentano, but also, and more importantly, (i) to reflect on the reasons for his thought's deep and discrete impact on the contemporary analytical debate and (ii) to explore, both historically (as in the very meticulous article by Thomas Binder) and conceptually, the reasons of such an underground presence.

And it is precisely in this sense that Fisette and Fréchette's work turns out to replace de facto Foucault's alleged prophecy with a quite different factual description. For what the contributions gathered in this volume seem to show, is that, yes, at least to some extent, this century is already Brentanian. One thing left to do now is to weigh knowingly the full importance of this fact.

[1] M. Foucault, "Theatrum philosophicum", Critique, November 1970, 885 :  "un jour le siècle sera déleuzien".

[2] On the topic, see P. Maniglier,"Deleuze, un métaphysicien dans le siècle", Magazine littéraire, n°406, February 2002, 26-28.

[3] Or, in the case of Nietzsche, would have quite certainly downgraded.

[4] See Brentano, Geschichte der griechischen Philosophie, Hamburg: Meiner 1988, 312 ff. (for the Stoics) Geschichte der mittelalterlichen Phiosophie, Hamburg: Meiner 1980, 37 ff. (for Scotus); Geschichte der Philosophie der Neuzeit, Hamburg, 46 (for Hume). It has to be said, however, that according to Brentano both Spinoza and Leibniz -- two authors cherished by Deleuze -- belong to the rising phase of philosophy (see 22-27).

[5] B. M. Mezei and B. Smith, The Four Phases of Philosophy, Atlanta-Amsterdam: Rodopi 1998. See especially 37 ff.

[6] G. Fréchette and D. Fisette, A l'école de Brentano: De Würzburg à Vienne, Paris, Vrin: 2007.

[7] The 1899 manuscript Abstraktion und Relation, followed by a selection of letters to Marty written in the same year (422-499); and the text of a paper presented by Brentano at the Philosophical Society at the University of Vienne in 1890: Moderne Irrthümer über die Erkenntnis der Gesetze des Schließens (501-524).

[8] J. L. Brandl, "What is pre-reflective Self-Awareness?" (41-66); M. Textor, "Unity without Self" (67-85); A. Chrudzimski, "Brentano and Aristotle on the Ontology of Intentionality" (121-138); W. Sauer, "Being as the True: from Aristotle to Brentano" (193-226); W. Baumgartner, "Franz Brentano's Mereology" (227-246); S. Gabriel, "Brentano at the Intersection of Psychology, Ontology and the Good" (247-271). 

[9] L. Cesalli, "Anton Marty's Intentionalist Theory of Meaning" (139-163); D. Fisette, "Mixed Feelings: Carl Stumpf's Criticism of James and Brentano on Emotions" (281-305); R. Martinelli, "Brentano and Stumpf on Tonal Fusion" (339-537).

[10] U. Kriegel, "Brentano's Most Striking Thesis" (23-40); G. Fréchette, "Brentano's Thesis (Revisited)" (91-119); M. Potrč, "Phenomenology of Intentionality" (165-187); O. Massin, "The Intentionality of Pleasures and Other Feelings" (30-397).

[11] T. Binder, "There and Back Again" (369-418).

[12] This list of Brentanian themes reproduces the internal structure of the book. TFB is divided into five sections of uneven length: (I) Consciousness: Brentanian and Neo-brentanian perspectives (77pp.), (II) Varieties of Intentionality (101pp.), (III) Ontology and Metaphysics (83pp.), (IV) Critics and Heirs: The School of Brentano (86pp.) and (V) Expositions and Discussions: Selected Materials and Translations (165pp.). Each section is preceded by a very useful introductory essay of the editors.

[13] No matter how differently spelled out: as "all mental states are conscious states" (so D. Rosenthal, "Concepts and Definitions of Consciousness", in P.W. Banks (ed.)Encyclopedia of Consciousness, Amsterdam: Elsevier 2009, 4); as "no-presentation without self-presentation" (as in U. Kriegel's works, see Subjective Consciousness: A Self-representational Theory, Oxford: Oxford UP 2009); or, more broadly, under the heading of "pre-reflective self-awareness".

[14] I use the term "trivialization" in a rather descriptive and non-judgmental sense.

[15] "Jedes psychische Phänomen ist durch das charakterisiert, was die Scholastiker . . . etc."

[16] See for instance V. Caston, "Aristotle and the Problem of Intentionality", in Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, LVIII, 2, June 1998; "Aristotle on Consciousness", in Mind 111, 751-815.

[17] I use the term in the way in which it has been spelled out by Alain De Libera firstly, but not exclusively, in his La Querelle des universaux: De Platon à la fin du Moyen Âge, Paris, Le Seuil: 1996.

[18] V. Caston,"Intentionality in Ancient Philosophy"  (

[19] J. Searle, Intentionality, CUP: Cambridge 1983, 1.

[20] M. Heidegger, The Basic Problems of Phenomenology, IUP: 1981, 65: "Intentionality is the ratio cognoscendi of transcendence. Transcendence is the ratio essendi of intentionality in its diverse modes".

[21] In this essay the author does not say anything new if compared with other previous publications. See for instance W. Baumgartner and P. Simons, "Brentanos Mereologie", in Brentano Studien, 4: 53-77 (eng. trans. by P. M. Simons: "Brentano's Mereology", Axiomathes, 5 (1994): 55-76).

[22] On the topic, see also A. Chrudzimski, Die Ontologie Franz Brentanos, Dordrecht: Kluwer 2004.

[23] In his "Brentano and the Reform of Elementary Logic" (in D. Jacquette (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Brentano, CUP: Cambridge 2004, 45-65) P. Simons limits himself to the statement that Brentano' contribution to logic is "modest but solid" (46) "of restrained but useful elegance". That is all he can consistently concede.

[24] What is also particularly interesting is the author's notion of "representation by courtesy" (28).

[25] Hence the presence of caveat such as "I will leave here open the question as to whether Brentano really did have in mind the distinction that I am proposing" (93); "let us simplify this terminology a little" (99); "I do not claim that this was exactly what Brentano had in mind" (114); "Whether this really reflects Brentano's account is another question" (117).

[26] Such as "Although Brentano does not put it in this way" or "[this term] does not belong to Brentano's own vocabulary" (46), etc.

[27] On this point see for instance G. Soldati, "Brentano über innere Wahrnehmung, intrinsische Wahrheit und Evidenz", in G. Keil and U. Tietz (Hrsg.), Phänomenologie und Sprachanalyse, Paderborn: Mentis 2005, 235-55, especially 237-43 and passim.

[28] On the issue, it is useful to refer to M. Antonelli, "Franz Brentano et l' 'inexistence intentionelle'", in Philosophiques, 36(2), 467-487.

[29] I should probably also mention that this article seems to have been already published elsewhere. I haven't checked the content, but the author has already published another paper with the very same title in Revue Roumaine de Philosophie, 2011, 55/1.