Theodor Adorno: Key Concepts

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Deborah Cook (ed.), Theodor Adorno: Key Concepts, Acumen, 2008, 212pp., $24.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651207.

Reviewed by Lambert Zuidervaart, University of Toronto


Theodor Adorno: Key Concepts could be called a brief "guide for the perplexed." The perplexed include scholars in many disciplines who encounter Adorno's ideas. They also include a larger public that confronts the issues he addressed: cultural segmentation, ecological destruction, democratic deficits, and paradoxes of globalization. Reading Adorno raises questions about the prospects for a world in which economic exploitation and political violence threaten to make life impossible.

Adorno experienced these threats in a visceral way. Driven from Germany during the Nazi regime and writing his first mature books in American exile, he returned to become a leading philosopher and social critic in post-war Germany. From there the influence of his ideas has spread to diverse fields around the world. Yet the center of his work lies in philosophy, and it is in philosophy that his most important contributions must be assessed.

The book under review reflects these patterns. It begins with surveys of Adorno's thought and its genealogy written by the editor, Canadian philosopher Deborah Cook. The next four chapters, by British and Norwegian philosophers, are on Adorno's reflections concerning logic, metaphysics, epistemology, and moral philosophy -- arguably the canonical core of modern philosophy. The last five chapters, written by American, British, and Irish scholars in sociology, German studies, English literature, and philosophy, address Adorno's social philosophy, political philosophy, aesthetics, philosophy of culture, and philosophy of history.

Cook provides a lucid introduction. Weaving together a narrative of his life with an exposition of central texts, she shows how even the more daunting of Adorno's concepts have social-critical inspiration and import. His concepts serve to challenge a society where an exploitative economy has primacy, and they also point toward radical emancipation. Cook's second chapter traces Adorno's key concepts back to Kant, Hegel, Marx, and Freud. Adorno's emphasis on the "non-identity" between "concept and object, mind and matter, the individual and society" (p. 23) stems from his complex reading of Kantian problematics concerning the thing-in-itself. This emphasis turns Adorno's appropriation of Hegel in the direction of a "negative dialectic." Adorno absorbs from Hegel both a reliance on determinate negation as the path to truth and a recognition of the interconnected character of society as a whole (albeit as a false totality, for Adorno). Adorno's dialectic is materialist, however, in a double sense: à la Marx, Adorno insists on the pervasive and constitutive character of capitalist production; à la Freud, he calls attention to the role of corporeal instincts and needs, and of their repression, in the formation of the self and civilization. Adorno's concept of "natural history" is a critical appropriation of both Marx and Freud.

Whereas Adorno employs his concepts to highlight "catastrophic tendencies in Western societies," subsequent critical theorists, led by Jürgen Habermas and Axel Honneth, have adopted a "more conciliatory view" (p. 33). Yet they retain much from Adorno's diagnosis of life under late capitalist conditions. The scope of his impact goes beyond Critical Theory, however. Cook mentions the flood of empirical research unleashed by The Authoritarian Personality, for example, as well as his influence on communications, literary studies, and musicology. What is lacking so far, she concludes, is an audience that could turn "his theoretical insights into emancipatory social practice" (p. 35). Cook does not consider whether this lack might indicate limitations to Adorno's insights.

It may surprise some readers that the next chapter is "Adorno and Logic" by Alison Stone. For, as Stone acknowledges, "Adorno has no logic in the sense of a theory of valid forms of argument and inference" (p. 47). Indeed, like Martin Heidegger, Adorno challenged what Dahlstrom has called the "logical prejudice" in much of Western philosophy.[1] Yet Adorno attempted to transform Hegel's dialectical logic into a "negative dialectic" obtaining "between concepts and objects" (p. 47). This attempt goes back to Kant's "transcendental logic," which identifies the "pure concepts of the understanding" -- the categories -- that necessarily structure any possible experience of objects. Criticizing Kant because he failed to demonstrate necessary relations among the categories, Hegel argues that they "always follow one another according to … a three-stage dialectical process." Moreover, they organize not only "our experience of objects" but also "things as they exist mind-independently" (p. 49).

Dialectic of Enlightenment sets the stage for Adorno's intricate reworking of both Kantian and Hegelian logics. There Horkheimer and Adorno argue that, by suppressing the rootedness of human beings in nature in the attempt to master nature and each other, the process of enlightenment reverts to myth, and culture reverts to nature. Only a dialectical reconciliation between culture and nature could fulfill the promise of enlightenment. Although this dialectic of enlightenment resembles Hegel's insistence on unity within opposition, Stone notes three important differences: Adorno's topic is a sociohistorical dialectic; he insists that the opposites (nature and culture) are not fundamentally the same; and he gives primacy to one side, claiming that culture depends on nature to a greater extent than nature depends on culture.

This pattern returns when Negative Dialectics foregrounds the "primacy of the object" over thought and the "non-identity" between concept and object. Adorno claims that modern philosophy has privileged thought and its concepts. As a result, philosophy has not done justice to that in the object which does not fit under concepts -- the unique side of every thing "by virtue of which things are identical neither to the kinds they embody nor to other instances of those kinds" (p. 54). Such "identity thinking" ignores or suppresses "the non-identical." It thereby takes part in the domination of nature that characterizes the dialectic of enlightenment. To counter identity thinking it would not suffice to propose "singularity," à la Hegel, as a universal category to cover everything non-identical. Nor, however, does Adorno want to ignore Hegel's critique of "sense-certainty" for supposing that we have immediate and nonconceptual experience of objects. Instead "Adorno sees the concept of the non-identical as a limit-concept" (p. 56). It lets us recognize the limitations to conceptual understanding, the dependence of our concepts upon objects, and the irreducibility of objects to our concepts. In such recognition, says Stone, would lie the path to Adornian reconciliation.

Yet Adorno agrees with Hegel that the recognition of conceptual limits necessarily leads to conceptual attempts to overcome them. What keeps Adorno from reverting to Hegel's idealism of the concept is a two-sided idea of "constellations." On the conceptual side, we can construct interlinked ranges of concepts that illuminate the uniqueness of an object without pretending to gain exhaustive insight into it. On the object side, each unique thing is a constellation of its historical relations with other things. Hence a constellation of concepts can "'gather around' the unique history of the object where this history makes the object the unique thing that it is" (p. 59). Although Stone mentions objections to Adorno's idea of constellations, she considers his contribution to (dialectical) logic "surprisingly fruitful" (p. 61).

Stone's essay lays indispensable groundwork for the chapters that follow. According to Espen Hammer's succinct chapter on metaphysics, Adorno criticizes traditional metaphysics both for subordinating "the particularity of human experience and … the concrete material world" to conceptions of totality and for celebrating "the immutable and non-temporal at the expense of the transient and temporal." In short, metaphysics violates experience and objects in their historical uniqueness. Adorno also objects that "metaphysics is essentially affirmative," serving to excuse rather than uncover and oppose societal evil (p. 65). In all three respects traditional metaphysics is incompatible with a post-Holocaust world.

Adorno does not abandon the metaphysical quest for transcendence, however. Following Walter Benjamin, he points toward metaphysical experience that promises "a transcendence from within" whatever is "transient and fragmentary" (p. 67). For Adorno such experience is not optional: without it we could not truly confront and resist the radical societal evil that Auschwitz exposed. As Hammer rightly suggests, this gives Adorno's mediations on metaphysics a strongly ethical and political inflection, unlike the "postmetaphysical" turn taken by both Habermas and postmodern thought. Adorno's emphatic concepts of truth, transcendence, and meaning may seem anachronistic. Yet if they are "implicit in a larger project with which even contemporary humanity can identify," Hammer concludes, then Adorno's reflections on metaphysics remain "relevant for both ethical orientation and political struggle" (p. 75).

In a substantial chapter on epistemology, Ståle Finke argues that Adorno provides a metacritique of both epistemology and ontology. Finke positions Adorno both between Edmund Husserl and Robert Brandom and beyond them. Against Husserl's phenomenology, Adorno aims to recover "a conception of experience … that is embedded in a linguistic form of life and practice" (p. 78). Yet Adorno does not think that linguistically mediated social practices go all the way down, such that "the meaning of experience" could be exhausted, à la Brandom, "in a discursively articulated idea of objectivity" (p. 86). What Adorno offers instead is the "non-identity" between subject and object, combined with an "affinity" among objects and between the object and experience. Such affinity is reactivated by mimetic conduct, whereby "the subject immerses itself in the things it attempts to present" (p. 91). For Adorno, language has a mimetic element, as do art and philosophy. Hence he can stress the conceptual and linguistic mediation of experience, yet maintain openness to that which is nonidentical -- to "dappled diversity," as Finke puts it. Finke exaggerates, however, when he says that Adorno's metacritique aims "to avoid unity and dwell only with particularity" (p. 94). For Adorno does not oppose universality and unity as such; he opposes the wrong kinds of universality and unity.

The issue of appropriate universality returns in an insightful chapter on moral philosophy by Fabian Freyenhagen. Adorno holds that "wrong life cannot be lived rightly," and he resists spelling out what a good life and a moral life would be like. The main reason why right living is blocked is that, in Adorno's judgment, "late capitalism is evil to the root" and "this evil is particularly grave." This is most clearly seen in "the moral catastrophe of Auschwitz" (p. 100). We live in a society where, no matter what we do, our actions implicate us in societal evil: either we inadvertently help maintain the societal system or we directly contribute to it. Swayed by ideologies that shore up the status quo, we become ever more enmeshed in the system, ever less capable of autonomy, of determining for ourselves what is the right thing to do.

Because living rightly is virtually impossible, moral philosophy lacks a substantive basis from which to provide an ethical theory. That is why Adorno regards all the moral philosophies on offer as inadequate. A formal Kantian ethics of conviction relies on intentions that either cannot be actualized or lead to disastrous consequences. A more substantive Hegelian ethics of responsibility presupposes a good social fabric and endorses the status quo. Nor would Nietzschean revaluation, existential authenticity, or Aristotelian virtue ethics fare any better.

Adorno's negative moral philosophy goes beyond critique, however. Freyenhagen says Adorno "puts forward an amalgam of ethical ideals [and] prescriptions" (p. 108). Adorno calls for solidarity that arises from an abhorrence of physical suffering. He advises us to "resist what society makes of us" (p. 109). He even posits a "new categorical imperative," namely, that we should not let anything like Auschwitz happen again. According to Freyenhagen, this minimalist approach jibes with Adorno's critiques of society and of moral philosophy. If right living is impossible, and if moral philosophy cannot underwrite morality, then "the most we can do is to live less wrongly" (p. 109).

Yet even such limited guidance seems to assume the moral autonomy -- as "self-determination" -- that late capitalism has supposedly destroyed. Freyenhagen tries to rescue Adorno from this apparent dilemma by saying that individual agents remain capable of negative freedom -- as "independence from external determination" (p. 110). The more pressing problem, however, is that Adorno cannot account for the normative standards -- the moral universals, if you will -- that his critiques and his minimal guidance seem to presuppose. Responding to recent discussions of this problem, Freyenhagen asserts that "Adorno can account for the normativity inherent in his philosophy without appeal to the good or the right" (p. 111). Although one is curious to see how the argument for this would go, I doubt that it would undo the lack of substantial normativity in Adorno's ethics.[2]

The background to this lack lies in Adorno's philosophy of history, the topic of an excellent essay by Brian O'Connor. If the issue of appropriate universality pervades Adorno's moral philosophy, then the issue of viable unity propels his reflections on history. Adorno struggles to wrest from Hegel an account of world history that does not sail blindly with the winds of continuity, rational progress, and "world spirit," yet does not shatter on the rocks of discontinuity, regressive irrationality, and ineffable individuality. As O'Connor shows, Adorno seeks the unity of continuity and discontinuity, of progress and regress, and of the social totality and its individual moments -- all with a view to challenging late capitalism.

O'Connor spells out the tensions that beset this Sisyphean effort. In the end, he says, Adorno subordinates elements of discontinuity and moments of individual resistance to a narrative of continuous decline and societal hegemony. Adorno proposes "a negativistic theory of progress," wherein progress comes to mean simply preventing or avoiding "total catastrophe" (pp. 186-7). Although Adorno occasionally hints toward collective agents that could bring about genuine progress, the likelihood of their forming is slim: "the historical process of integration that creates a coercive totality might also create the conditions for an agency adequate to the action required to resist the integrational historical process" (p. 193).

Combined with the normative gap in Adorno's ethics, the virtual absence of collective agency spells trouble for Adorno's social and cultural theories. Yet the four chapters on these topics skate lightly around the trouble. Pauline Johnston indicates the relevance of Adorno's social philosophy for feminism but sticks to common themes in Frankfurt School thought. Marianne Tettlebaum's chapter on political philosophy summarizes Adorno's reflections on class, democracy, and education but does not take up his subsuming relations among economy, state, and civil society under an all-pervasive logic of domination. Ross Wilson correctly describes Adorno's aesthetics as overcoming "the opposition of Kantian and Hegelian aesthetics" (p. 153) to address the "paradoxical nature of autonomous art in contemporary society" (p. 157) but does not explicate distinctive Adornian concepts such as technique and truth content. Robert Witkin construes Adorno's philosophy of culture as playing out an opposition between reified pseudo-culture (Halbbildung) and (true) Culture, which, Witkin claims, would dynamically express subjective spirit. His construal forgets that Adorno sees reification as intrinsic to authentic art and not simply as a curse visited upon mass culture.

Despite such missed opportunities to deepen our understanding, this collection accomplishes its goal: to lead us "through the intricate labyrinth of Adorno's work." It is a reliable guide and will leave readers of Adorno less perplexed. Perhaps they will also be more ready to take up the issues he addressed.

[1] Daniel O. Dahlstrom, Heidegger's Concept of Truth (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001), p. 17.

[2] See Lambert Zuidervaart, Social Philosophy after Adorno (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007), pp. 155-81.