Theological-Political Treatise

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Benedict de Spinoza, Theological-Political Treatise, Jonathan Israel (ed., trans.), Michael Silverthorne (trans.), Cambridge University Press, 2007, 280pp., $19.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521530972.

Reviewed by Francesca di Poppa, Texas Tech University




 The Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series' goal is to offer high quality, reasonably priced texts to students in philosophy -- both undergraduate and graduate -- as well as to a general public interested in the history of ideas. This new translation of Spinoza's Theological-Political Treatise, edited by Jonathan Israel, is a welcome addition to this series.

In his works Radical Enlightenment and Enlightenment Contested, Jonathan Israel discusses the impact of Spinoza's work on European intellectual history, an impact that Israel considers decisive in shaping philosophical and political debates of the 18th century and beyond. The works responsible for this revolution were Theological-Political Treatise and Ethics.

While Spinoza's Ethics Demonstrated According to the Geometrical Order was published only after his death in 1677, Theological-Political Treatise was published anonymously in 1670. Jan Rieuwertsz, Spinoza's publisher, printed it under a false publisher name and place of publication, well aware that printing this subversive work violated even Holland's relatively lenient censorship laws. With all these cautions, the retiring Dutch philosopher was identified as the author of the pestilentissimus book, and soon enough his reputation as a blasphemer and atheist was established.

The incensed reactions were justified, in a sense. As the title makes clear, the Theological-Political Treatise addresses both religion and politics, defending controversial positions in both fields. Spinoza's rigorous argument against miracles was a prime target for the religious establishment, but his advocacy of radical democracy, freedom of speech (far beyond what was allowed in his country), and especially of restraining the interference of the clergy also raised much consternation.

In this new edition of Theological-Political Treatise, Israel offers a new translation (prepared by Michael Silverthorne and revised by Israel) based on the scholarly version of the Latin work published by PUF.[1] References are given to page numbers in the Gebhart edition. The result is an eminently readable work that does not sacrifice precision to clarity to the extent that Elwes' translation often does.

The book includes Spinoza's supplementary notes, a historical-critical introduction, an analytic index and a bibliography of selected recent works. The Introduction focuses on Spinoza's main goal in writing TTP: defending libertas philosophandi. This term is usually translated "freedom to philosophize." As Israel remarks, however, Spinoza refers to something wider than our common concept of "philosophy": libertas philosophandi is a comprehensive freedom of thought and speech. It entails freedom of thought, freedom of speech and freedom of artistic expression, but also freedom to pursue scientific investigations, to print, own and discuss any books, and to teach controversial positions without fear of prosecution or retaliation.

For libertas philosophandi to exist and thrive, its enemies need to be kept in check. The worst enemies are, in Spinoza's eyes, religious authorities stepping out of their boundaries and exercising illegitimate influence on the government and the citizenry. So, Spinoza's goal is to undermine religious (both Christian and Jewish) authorities by exposing their deceit. He shows that their abuse of power is not based on, or condoned by, the Scriptures and that most of their commands, rituals and dogmas are not necessary for salvation.

Spinoza put forward a devastating critique of the notion of "Biblical authority." The idea that the Bible is authoritative is based on the belief that its authors were directly inspired by God, thus accessing certain theological truths that are not available to the rest of us. Spinoza shows this notion to be mistaken: the "divinely inspired" prophet is simply a person with a lively (if not overactive) imagination.

Spinoza's conclusion is based on a methodology that is as revolutionary as the conclusion itself. For Spinoza, the examination of Scripture must be performed with a "free and unprejudiced mind." Such a mind steers clear of what, for Spinoza, is the 'original sin' in Biblical exegesis: that is, the assumption that the "intended meaning" of the Bible must be consistent with what is known, or believed, to be factually true. For the first time in the history of Bible scholarship, Israel emphasizes, Spinoza separates "true meaning" from "truth of fact." The unprejudiced Bible scholar will search for the true meaning of a passage -- and must do so based only on factors internal to the Bible, such as a deep investigation into the historical (social, political) and linguistic background. Based on these elements, Spinoza attacks the traditional notion that the Bible contains important factual truths encrypted in its prophecies and stories. The Bible is not a reliable source of knowledge about God or nature; indeed, offering such knowledge is not its goal. The purpose of the Bible is to promote obedience to the law.

While his argument against prophetic authority is based on philological and historical factors, Spinoza's main argument against miracles is openly philosophical. It is here that he appears to contradict his own methodology, conflating "truth of meaning" with "truth of fact." Spinoza concludes that a miracle is an event that the writer could not explain based on his knowledge of nature. Prima facie, however, it is more plausible that the authors originally meant by "miracle" a direct divine intervention in the fabric of nature, rather than an event that fills one with wonder and cannot be explained by known regularities.

Spinoza explains at the end of his Book 6 (On Miracles) that the possibility of miracles is a philosophical question, to be addressed by the "natural light of reason." Nevertheless, he addresses the question according to his historical method, arguing that Biblical authors never intended to teach that something can happen in violation of the laws of nature. When extraordinary events occurred, they were ascribed to the will and power of God in order to instigate obedience; this does not entail the conclusion that God can intervene to disrupt the fabric of nature, or that belief in miracles is necessary for salvation. For Spinoza, "necessary for salvation" are beliefs that promote good behavior, such as "love thy neighbor." If one needs to believe in miracles and hell in order to love her neighbor, so be it: she will be good out of obedience. Only those who love their neighbor based on philosophical reasoning are truly blessed.

The last part of TTP is a presentation of Spinoza's political philosophy. After showing that traditional theological beliefs are neither supported by the Bible nor necessary for salvation, Spinoza moves on to defend libertas philosophandi. Spinoza's goal here is more ambitious than simply showing that such freedom does not compromise the stability and order of the government. As promised in the title page of TTP, he powerfully argues that the absence of libertas philosophandi is destructive of both stability and piety.

In his previous works Israel pointed out an important feature of Spinoza's defense of toleration, a feature that puts him, as it were, on a collision course with the other famous 17th century paladin of toleration, John Locke. While Locke's endorsement of toleration is centered on freedom of worship, and excludes atheists as well as -- on different grounds --Catholics, for Spinoza freedom of worship is marginal. On the contrary, he is more interested in thwarting the efforts of the various organized religions to acquire power and interfere with the res publica. Spinoza makes a distinction between freedom of individual worship, which ought to be warranted, and "empowering churches to organize, expand, and extend their authority freely," which gives them an undue control and authority over the lives of citizens as well as on political deliberations. Spinoza must have certainly had in mind -- Israel suggests -- the kind of authoritarian control that the Portuguese Synagogue in Amsterdam tried to exert on his own philosophizing. Israel plausibly argues that Spinoza's condemnation of "seditious speech" (which undermines the very existence of the government) is aimed at religious authorities encouraging the ignorant to challenge laws that they label as "ungodly."

Thus, restraining churches is the only way for a government to grant libertas philosophandi to citizens. Such freedom is a necessary component of a stable and thriving state. The government can control behaviors, but not beliefs. Because, for Spinoza, the government's rights extend as far as its power, it follows that to control beliefs and speech is beyond the government's rights. Moreover, for Spinoza, the more despotic a government is, the less stable: citizens are much more likely to support and defend a government with which they can identify because they have a role in its rulemaking process. For Spinoza, democracy (with all its flaws) is the form of government that best allows human nature to flourish. A state in which individuals, especially the most educated and philosophically minded, are active in political life, free to discuss and challenge -- as long as the challenge does not become sedition -- and to make their own life choices is the most likely to become stable and prosperous.

Israel's Introduction offers a good, if short, overview of these main themes and their philosophical and historical context. The translation is overall quite readable and effective. As explained in the Introduction, Israel and Silverthorne follow the accepted practice of breaking down Spinoza's lengthy paragraphs for readability. Readability is certainly desirable, and this translation is mostly successful in making the readability requirement consistent with a good level of precision. Unfortunately, there are a few instances in which textual precision is sacrificed in the name of readability and in an attempt to avoid those repetitions that are so frequent in Spinoza.  For example:

… I Quia homo, quatenus pars est Naturae, eatenus partem potentiae Naturae constituit; quae igitur ex necessitate naturae humanae sequuntur, hoc est ex Natura ipsa, quatenus eam per naturam humanam determinatam concipimus, ea, etamsi necessario, sequuntur tamen ab humana potentia…

The passage is translated as:

Firstly, insofar as man is a part of nature, he is also a part of nature's power. Hence, whatever follows from the necessity of human nature (that is, from nature itself insofar as we understand it to be expressly determined by human nature) results also, albeit necessarily, from the capacity of men…  (p. 57)

Since potentia is a technical term for Spinoza, and a quite important one, a consistent translation of it as "power" would be preferable.[2] Moreover, the Silverthorne-Israel translation, following Shirley, adds, after "determined," "expressly," which is not in the Latin text (and is not found in the Lagrée and Moreau French translation). Again, since expressio and exprimere are important technical terms in Spinoza, I find the addition unnecessary.

Despite these few shortcomings, which do not affect the overall quality of the work (especially considering its target audience), this translation is more than adequate, and a welcome alternative to Shirley's 1989 translation for anyone interested in the history of philosophy and of political thought.[3]

[1] Spinoza: Oeuvres, vol. III: Tractatus Theologico-Politicus-Traité Théologico-Politique. Text established by Fokke Akkerman; French translation and comment by Jacqueline Lagrée and Pierre-François Moreau. Paris: Presses Universitaire de France, 1999.

[2] Shirley's 1989 English translation, as well as the 1999 French by Lagrée and Moreau (from the Latin text established by Akkerman on which the Silverthorne-Israel translation is based), translate potentia consistently as "power" and "puissance."

[3] Reprinted by Hackett in 2001 as Theological-Political Treatise, translated by Samuel Shirley with an introduction by Seymour Feldman. Hackett Publishing Company, Indianapolis.