Theology's Epistemological Dilemma: How Karl Barth and Alvin Plantinga Provide a Unified Response

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Kevin Diller, Theology's Epistemological Dilemma: How Karl Barth and Alvin Plantinga Provide a Unified Response, InterVarsity Press, 2014, 326pp., $34.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780830839063.

Reviewed by S. Joel Garver, La Salle University


As a Christian believer, Kevin Diller finds himself faced with a dilemma: Christian theology "is forced to sit uncomfortably with a high view of knowledge and a low view of the unaided capacities of the human knower to self-secure such knowledge" (39). This "low view" of human capacities is not merely a matter of general skeptical worries or the chastening effects of failed Enlightenment pretensions. Rather, it is the specifically Christian character of truth claims about God that generate both the difficulty and, Diller will argue, the possibility of a resolution. For if God is to be God, then we will have to give up any supposed approach to God grounded in natural human reason, prior to and unconstrained by God's own movement toward us in Christ. And, if God is to be God, then only God's own self-disclosure can be the basis for any human claim to know God.

Karl Barth and Alvin Plantinga serve as tag-team partners in Diller's "theo-foundational" account of the epistemology of Christian knowledge of God. He begins with Barth in Chapters 2 and 3, providing a lucid and readable interpretation of Barth's theology of revelation, summarized in four claims. First, any theological epistemology must itself emerge through reflection upon the already-given gift of knowing God. Second, knowing God is, for Barth, a "personal, cognitive, participative" knowing (54). Third, God himself takes the initiative in revelation, not just once -- as if revelation were a deposit we could grasp onto or as if God handed himself over to the creaturely form of revelation -- but in a continual self-attestation, a miracle of grace. Finally, knowing God always transforms and reconciles the knowing person.

Given Barth's approach to knowing God, the question arises whether Barth has any use for philosophy at all. Indeed, Barth's "no" to philosophy appears decisive. Diller, however, argues that Barth's rejection of philosophy is only a rejection insofar as philosophy might strive to know God from-below, in its own strength, independent of God's self-disclosure. Thus Barth, according to Diller, does not reject outright the language and tools of philosophy insofar as they depend upon and reflect upon the prior fact of revelation.

This revelation-dependent Christian philosophy opens the way for Diller to deploy Plantinga's account of warrant in Chapter 4. While recognizing important differences in emphasis and approach between Plantinga and Barth, Diller urges us to see a deeper resonance and commonality between them. In particular, both thinkers hold out the possibility of Christian scholarship and philosophy in which the specific content of theology takes precedence over any supposedly theologically neutral approach. Diller follows up this claim with a careful and helpful exposition of Plantinga's account of epistemic warrant. His account proceeds in large part by cataloging the failures of traditional accounts of epistemic justification and offering, following Plantinga, the notion of "warrant" as the only alternative. Plantinga's account is well-known, so I will forgo a summary here.

From Plantinga's general account of warrant, Diller turns in Chapter 5 to warranted Christian belief, beginning with Plantinga's basic "Aquinas/Calvin" (A/C) model. The A/C model takes up Calvin's notion of a sensus divinitatis as providing a divinely designed innate capacity for knowing God, involving properly basic beliefs about God, not inferred from other beliefs.

If this is all Plantinga offered, Barth would likely object to it for the same sorts of reasons he rejected Emil Brunner's notion of a natural (even if God-given) capacity for knowing God. But it is really Plantinga's "extended" A/C model that Diller wishes to offer as complementary to Barth.

The extended A/C model accommodates the "noetic effects of sin," which disable any innate capacity for knowing God. This extended model is specifically Christian in shape, incorporating the Christian scriptures, the work of the Holy Spirit, and faith. It is especially Plantinga's notion of the "internal instigation of the Holy Spirit" (IIHS) where Diller sees an affinity with Barth.

The IIHS operates on the occasion of reading or hearing the biblical message, granting a "kind of perception whereby a person comes to grasp the truth" of the gospel (148). The self-evident immediacy thereby experienced is a kind of faith-engendering perception resulting from the action of the Spirit. Diller argues that this extended model, incorporating the IIHS, exhibits a "striking compatibility" with Barth's theology of revelation (164), giving it an epistemologically rigorous formulation.

After a summative and integrative interlude, Diller fills out the rest of his volume with three clarifying and elucidating chapters: Chapter 7 on the Reformed objection to natural theology, Chapter 8 on faith and revelation and genuine knowledge of God, and Chapter 9 on the central and indispensable role of scripture.

Regarding natural theology, Diller explains Barth's vigorous objection to any possibility of natural theology, outlining Barth's "driving concerns," particularly as they come out in his exchange with Brunner. For Barth, God's self-disclosure is always given supernaturally and directly, as a sort of miracle that transcends any natural capacity on the part of creatures, whether in the form of the divine image in humanity (for Brunner) or of an analogy of being (for Roman Catholicism).

Barth's view here differs from Plantinga's more modest view that natural theology is merely neither necessary nor sufficient for warranted Christian belief. For Plantinga, Christian beliefs do not need to be held as the conclusion of an argument and, indeed, it would be improper to do so -- even if arguments might have some ancillary role, such as defeating doubts.

Whatever their differences in emphasis, both Barth and Plantinga nonetheless affirm that it is the free action of God that exclusively provides ultimate warrant for knowing God. Both adopt a kind of particularism that moves inductively from the givenness of Christian revelation to an epistemology of knowing God. Both reject neutral and noncommittal exercises of reason, standing outside of divine self-disclosure, as a proper way of understanding God.

Regarding faith and revelation, while Plantinga allows the possibility of a "warranted abstract knowledge of God independent of the work of the Spirit" (261), Barth -- though not disallowing the mere possibility -- finds it irrelevant to his primary concern: God's revelation. For Barth, "revelation," properly speaking, is a personal, transforming work of the Spirit by faith.

Plantinga's account, with its discussion of propositional knowledge and proper names, helps clarify Barth's approach and stands in agreement with it, inasmuch as it is Plantinga's "extended" A/C model in play, with the integral role of the IIHS. Reference to God, therefore, comes about by the analogy of faith, in which God himself grasps the human knower.

Regarding scripture, we face the question of how created and human means of revelation relate to a divine self-disclosure that never becomes confused or mixed with created means, nor is it handed over to and contained by those means. While scripture is fully human, it always remains dependent upon God's immediate and ongoing action. Inspiration does not collapse the humanity of the scriptural witness into the divinity of the one revealed. Barth and Plantinga give us a way of thinking about how the triune God himself ever remains the "ground of warrant" for our knowing him (294).

Diller's book never fails to provide a careful, clear, and cogent account of the complex and sometimes subtle topics under consideration. He anticipates objections and provides always-helpful explanations of concepts, terms, and difficulties. Diller's responses to many common criticisms are helpful and effective, particularly when it comes to Plantinga and the secondary literature on Plantinga's religious epistemology and approach to warrant. Sometimes, however, Diller is a bit redundant in his quest for clarity, lapsing into excessive road-mapping -- what's been said, what we're doing now, where we're headed next -- like an overly chatty GPS system.

As for his main thesis -- the profound consistency and coherence of a combined Barth-Plantinga approach to questions of theological epistemology -- Diller's case is, to my mind, compelling. Barth and Plantinga, rightly interpreted and employed, not only supplement, but also mutually enhance one another. Where the details of Barth's epistemology or philosophy of language are sometimes scant or murky, Diller successfully employs Plantinga to defend and elucidate. If one is going to embrace a Barth-Plantinga perspective on Christian belief as a resolution to the epistemological dilemma of theology, this is certainly the way to do it.

And yet, for those of us who have nagging anxieties about Barth's account of revelation and knowledge of God, Diller's volume does not entirely dispel those concerns or answer all questions.

To begin, simply as a matter of clarification, it is worth noting that the Reformed tradition is not uniformly opposed to all conceptions of "natural theology" and that Barth is, in some respects, an odd duck on this topic. The noetic effects of sin are, in the Reformed understanding, pervasive and powerful. Nevertheless, the tradition (especially in its early scholastic varieties) has also typically allowed for a natural knowledge of God sufficient to leave humanity, in Paul's words, "without excuse" and, thus, for a robust doctrine of general revelation through the created order.

More importantly, I wish Diller had attended to objections to Barth's approach to revelation as much as he responded to criticisms of Plantinga. While Diller did summarize the contours of the debate between Brunner and Barth around the topic of a "natural capacity" for revelation, Brunner's stakes in that theological debate are left underdeveloped. In the context of 1930s Germany, Barth was certainly justified in his fears that the church might too closely align God's will and divine self-disclosure with the aspirations and cultural attainments of the nation.

With Brunner, however, one might worry that Barth overcorrected the problem in ways that create new problems (assuming one can even speak of a consistent position across Barth's corpus of writings; Church Dogmatics II/2, to my mind, seems to mark some kind of shift). One difficulty emerges, for instance, in the difference between Barth and Plantinga on the sensus divinitatis as it appears in the (not-extended) A/C model -- a difficulty that Diller discusses in Chapter 8.

On Plantinga's A/C model, human beings, apart from their fallenness, would enjoy a natural capacity -- albeit a graciously given and sustained capacity -- by which they might affirm some truths about God: his existence, his power, his deserving worship. Human sin, however, ordinarily causes this capacity to fail. Plantinga develops his notion of the "internal instigation of the Holy Spirit" (IIHS) as a response to the failure of the A/C model in light of human fallenness.

For Barth, however, it is not merely fallenness that the Holy Spirit must overcome, but human finitude as such -- a problem of nature, not sin. Whatever human beings might be able to affirm about God apart from their fallenness, it would not count for Barth as "revelation" in the proper sense. It would lack the personal, active, direct, and self-revealing encounter with God that Barth sees as constituting "revelation". Moreover, Barth seems to reject this unfallen sense of the divine as any sort of "capacity" for knowing God.

By downplaying what knowledge Plantinga's A/C model can give and by playing up everything built into Barth's notion of revelation, Diller succeeds in deflecting any direct contradiction between the two thinkers on this point. But this does nothing to resolve the issues raised by Barth's perspective. I continue to find Barth puzzling on these points.

By rejecting of any notion of an inherent "capacity" for revelation on the part of the creature (even a capacity only recognized in a deduction from the already given fact of revelation), Barth appears to posit a kind of "pure human nature" that is prior to and outside of grace. Such a nature, it seems, would have to remain entirely self-enclosed, awaiting a revelation that comes out of nowhere and which bears no relationship to anything that came before it.

Barth, as Diller explains him, wants to maintain that human beings are absolutely dependent upon God to know God. But how does this exclude every notion of a human potential to know God? The human eye, for instance, has a capacity for sight even locked in a dark cellar. But actually seeing requires there to be light and objects to be seen. And the eye, in the exercise of its capacity, is utterly dependent upon light and objects, which the eye cannot simply demand, but can only receive as a gift.

Why not say, then, that God has created us with a graciously-given capacity for himself oriented toward an even more gracious fulfillment that lies beyond the capacity's power to attain? Unlike the eye, which is not immediately and directly dependent upon light and objects for its existence, our capacity for God, on such an account, never stands outside of grace or apart from a personal encounter with God himself.

Barth's account of scripture, at least as Diller expounds it, is similarly puzzling. History and humanity -- even the humanity of Jesus -- lack any "inherent capacity" to reveal God. But then it seems that revelation, at every moment, remains extrinsic and external to creation -- even in the person of Jesus Christ -- except insofar as it is accompanied by a direct, immediate, personal action of God.

How then is revelation not some sort of violence against creation? Does this verge too closely to some kind of occasionalism? Can we still say that by being caught up into God's self-disclosure that creation more truly becomes what it was always meant to be? Can we maintain that in revealing himself in Jesus Christ, that God has also revealed the true meaning of being human?

Perhaps Barth has adequate answers to these questions and concerns, but if so, Diller does not address them. And this, in my estimation, is the primary weakness of an otherwise stimulating, forceful, and convincing synthesis of two of the 20th century's greatest minds.