Theoretical Philosophy after 1781

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Kant, Immanuel, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, edited by Henry Allison and Peter Heath, translated by Gary Hatfield, Michael Friedman, Henry Allison, and Peter Heath, Cambridge, 2002, 544pp, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521460972.

Reviewed by Manfred Kuehn , Philipps-Universitat Marburg


This volume brings together translations of seven works by Kant written after 1781. They are all more or less based on the edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften, published by the Königlich preußische Akademie der Wissenschaften (Berlin, 1900-). But the translators are continuing the tradition begun in the earlier volumes of this series and carefully attempt to improve on the texts of the Berlin Academy edition. Of the works presented here, five were published during Kant’s lifetime, namely the Prolegomena to any Future Metaphysics that will be Able to Come Forward as a Science of 1783 (translated by Gary Hatfield), the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science of 1786 (translated by Michael Friedman), On a Discovery whereby any New Critique of Pure Reason is Made Superfluous by an Older One of 1790 (translated by Henry Allison), On a Recently Prominent Tone of Superiority in Philosophy of 1796, Settlement of a Mathematical Dispute Founded on Misunderstanding of 1796 and Proclamation of the Imminent Conclusion of a Treaty of Perpetual Peace in Philosophy of 1796 (translated by Peter Heath). Also included is What Real Progress Has Metaphysics Made in Germany since the Time of Leibniz and Wolff? (translated by Peter Heath), which was written in 1793, but published posthumously in 1804 by F. T. Rink. It also contains a translation of the notes appended by the editors of the Academy edition.

The volume follows what has become the standard layout of this edition of Kant’s works (though it does not contain the “Biographical Sketches” found in some of the other volumes). Apart from the “General Editor’s Preface,” it includes most useful Introductions by Henry Allison (“General Introduction,” and an “Editor’s Introduction” to What Real Progress?) and detailed and equally useful translators introductions to most of the works, but On a Recently Prominent Tone of Superiority, Settlement of a Mathematical Dispute and Proclamation of the Imminent Conclusion of a Treaty of Perpetual Peace in Philosophy do not have Introductions and their translators are not indicated. Furthermore, there are extensive editorial notes to all works except to the short Settlement of a Mathematical Dispute. The edition is rounded out by a glossary, an index of names and an index of subjects.

As I indicated in an earlier review of the volume on Theoretical Philosophy, 1755-1770, one might quibble with the general conception of this work (and accordingly the edition as a whole): Why divide the volumes into Theoretical Philosophy, Practical Philosophy, Religion and Rational Theology, Anthropology, History and Education? To some extent this way of dividing up Kant’s philosophical work is of course founded in his texts, but it also remains largely anachronistic and separates what should not be separated. Why did the editors not follow a strictly temporal order, like that of the Academy edition? Some of the problems connected with this division show up most clearly in this volume. As Allison notes in the “General Introduction”, the writings collected in this volume “constitute only a small portion of Kant’s total output after 1781” (1). And one might add, a portion that can be understood only with great difficulties apart from the other works of this period. This is especially true of the three works from 1796 that must clearly be seen in connection with the more famous Toward Perpetual Peace: A Philosophical Project of 1795, not included here. “What is Enlightenment?” “What is Orientation in Thinking?” “On the Use of Teleological Principles in Philosophy,” and “The Definition of Race,” are also elsewhere. In any case, the two last essays of the volume, directed against Johann Georg Schlosser, might be said to belong more properly in the context of practical philosophy. One might also object to the fact that a work that Kant himself did not see fit to publish himself (What Real Progress?) is here found together with published works. It might well be argued that it belongs together with other posthumous “works” of Kant. But these are quibbles, after all. Allison is quite clear on the problematic character of this text. Furthermore, when the Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant is complete all works will be equally and easily available in good and consistent translations for those who read Kant in English, and that is clearly more important than in what particular volume one finds which work.

The most important work included in this edition is the Prolegomena. Its translation “is a variant of” Hatfield’s edition in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy (46), containing a more extensive critical apparatus and a revised translation of “schwärmerisch” as “visionary” and of “Bedeutung” as “significance” or “signification” when Kant uses it to indicate that the categories have no application outside of experience. The second most important work is the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science. Friedman departs significantly, perhaps even “fundamentally” (179) from the two previous translations of this work; and it is clearly much more readable than they are. On a Discovery represents a complete revision of Allison’s earlier translation in The Kant-Eberhard Controversy (1973). Kant’s planned contribution to the prize essay competition of 1792 (see p. 339) is an entirely new translation that follows in some points the French translation of this work by Louis Guillermit (1973). While most of the works contained in this edition fail to break new ground (with the exception of the Prolegomena and the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science), the translations will be useful to those seeking better to understand Kant’s main works and especially the Critique of Pure Reason. One of the most important functions this edition serves consists in providing materials for a better understanding of Kant’s relationship to “Leibnizian” and “Platonic” philosophy, where “Leibnizian” and “Platonic” refers of course not primarily to Leibniz and Plato, but to the followers of Leibniz and Plato during Kant’s lifetime. Kant argues in these works against Johann August Eberhard, who claimed that Leibnizian philosophy contained not just Kant’s critical discussion of traditional metaphysics but also a “well-grounded extension” of it. He claimed that Eberhard had actually misunderstood Leibniz and that his own work was closer to the spirit of Leibniz than that of the supposed “Leibnizians.” Schlosser, who spread an esoteric form of platonizing Christian doctrine, which considered “feeling” as a privileged access to truth is criticized even more harshly by Kant. This volume sheds light on these issues. It is therefore an important contribution to Kant scholarship.

One may hope that the Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science will soon be published as a paperback. I would also hope that some of the shorter and more significant pieces of this and other volumes will be collected to form a paperback of Kant’s minor writings.

All in all, Theoretical Philosophy after 1781 represents an excellent edition and translation of some of Kant’s works written after the publication of the first edition of his Critique of Pure Reason. It can, of course, be no real substitute for reading Kant in German, but it will give those who venture on this task invaluable help and provide those who are unwilling or unable to do so the next best thing: a solid translation. The book testifies to the high quality of work done on Kant in English, a quality that often exceeds by far that done in Kant’s native language.