Theorie der Kausalitat: Ein Leitfaden zum Kausalitatsbegriff in zwei Teilen

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Meixner, Uwe, Theorie der Kausalitat: Ein Leitfaden zum Kausalitatsbegriff in zwei Teilen, Mentis Verlag, 2001, 582pp, 82 euros (pbk), ISBN 3897851857.

Reviewed by Gerhard Schurz, University of Duesseldorf


Uwe Meixner’s voluminous book consists of two parts. Part I (pp. 23-218) presents Meixner’s systematic theory and logic of causality. Part II (pp. 219-525) contains a critical discussion of the contemporary philosophical literature. To some degree, part II delivers the motivation for the definitions and arguments Meixner gives in part I. This makes Meixner’s book at bit hard to read, at least for readers concerned with philosophical motivation.

Meixner’s theory of causation is an attempt to rehabilitate a strict nomological regularity theory of causation (cf. p. 42) — an approach, which in the recent decades has been under severe attack and, as a result, has become a minority approach, pushed back by an increasing number of counterfactual and probabilistic accounts of causality. Meixner begins by presenting three intuitive requirements (p. 26): causes are sufficient conditions for their effects, (b) they necessitate their effects and (c) they are temporally earlier than their effects. However, only condition (c) is literally implemented in Meixner’s final explication of causality. Con-dition (b) is reduced to the requirement that the relation between cause and effect is a necessary one (cf. p. 96f), and condition (a) is transformed into a condition which requires that the cause together with a certain background condition — roughly speaking, the real world’s history until the latest point in time before the cause happens — is nomologically sufficient for the effect. The crucial difference between Meixner’s theory and the majority of causality accounts in the recent literature is that Meixner’s theory has no version of a necessary-condition-requirement or relevance-requirement. In part II of his book, Meixner heavily criticizes all kinds of necessary-condition- or relevance-accounts of causality (ch. *1, *3, *7) — but we shall see soon that to some extent, Meixner himself becomes victim of this rather extreme position.

Meixner bases his analysis on the semantics of tree-structured possible world universes, which has been developed by von Wright and especially by Meixner’s teacher, Franz von Kutschera. Here one assumes as primitive notions a set T of well-ordered time points (with ordering relation <) and a set Z of possible total states of the world at a given time point. Pow(Z), the power set of Z, contains all ‘partial’ states, which are represented as sets (disjunctions) of total states, as usual. A possible world is then a function w:T→Z attaching to each time point a total state. A possible world universe U is a set of such functions satisfying the tree requirement (i.e., all worlds in U have a unique root state zo= w(0), and distinct states w(i)≠w*(i) always lead to distinct successor states w(i+1)≠w*(i+1)). A primary event e is, according to Meixner, a function of a set of time points Te, e: Te → Pow(Z), mapping each time point in Te into a partial state (ordinarily, Te will be a time interval, but this need not be so). Event e happens in world w if for each t∈Te, w(t) ∈ e(t). A secondary event, according to Meixner, is a set of primary events which contains for each world at most one primary event happening in this world (this idea of a secondary event goes back to D. Lewis; cf. Meixner p. 432ff). Secondary events are particulars and not types, because they are not repeatable within one world; they rest on a sort of counterpart relation for events among possible worlds which is certainly a problem of its own. A special kind of secondary events are secondary C-events, which are secondary events containing only maximal primary events (where a primary event is maximal if its values are singleton sets of total states.) Secondary C-events have intuitive disadvantages, but Meixner introduces them on the technical ground that they are expressible within the object language (while secondary events are not so expressible).

Meixner develops two notions of causation, one for primary and one for secondary events. His first notion is this (p. 43ff): e causes1 e* iff (1) e, e* are primary events such that Te has a first time point t which is preceded by at least one time point, (2) all time points in Te are before all time points in Te*, and (3) for all worlds w which coincide with the real world w* at all time points t’ <>2 E*” is given, where E and E* are secondary C-events (ibid).

Let me first mention the major achievement of Meixner’s theory of causality, which in my view is a logical achievement: Meixner’s theory is fully expressible in the object language of the modal logic of Kutschera with tense operators, a causal operator and a necessity operator (p. 45ff, 190ff); for a slightly weaker system — namely Kutschera’s W×T frames — a completeness proof has been given by S. Wölfl (JPL 1999). The fact that Meixner’s theory of causality does not include certain refined conditions, which we will discuss, now can be explained (and if you want: ‘excused’) by the fact that Meixner was interested in a concept of causality which is simple enough to be expressible within the object language of Kutschera’s W×T logic. The following aspects of Meixner’s theory are problematic:

(1) The assumption of a tree universe means that the world is not deterministic with respect to its future (i.e., future branchings are possible), but it is deterministic with respect to its past (i.e., branchings into the past are impossible). It is unclear why this should be the case. Physically speaking, different initial states leading to the same final equilibrium state are rather plausible situations in a non-deterministic universe. Since logically speaking the tree structure requirement is not expressible in the object language of modal logic, it is recommended to expand this setting into T×W-frames, which admit of acyclic graphs.

(2) Although Meixner’s possible world universes are non-deterministic with respect to the future, his definition of causality is deterministic, i.e., it requires exceptionless regularities from past causes to future effects. Apart from the question whether this is not an incoherence in itself, it is doubtful from the viewpoint of physics that there exists any exceptionless causal succession laws in the real world (cf., e.g., J. Earman, . primer on determinism). Since in Meixner’s definition, the boundary conditions, which are implicit in the frozen history, are all temporally before cause and effect happen, nothing can exclude an intervening event, which prevents the cause from producing the effect. Hence Meixner’s entire account is endanger of being void of applications. While Meixner’s defense against this challenge is surprisingly weak, one may suggest that his model should be understood as an idealization restricted to models of deterministic theories, or to worlds which satisfy certain normality conditions.

(3) However that may be: even if one grants to Meixner a scenario where strict causal succession laws exist, his account of causality exhibits a severe defect which has to do with the above-mentioned failure to take into account a necessary-condition-requirement or relevance-requirement. Here is the counterexample:

Assume the following deterministic scenario (an example of Meixner, pp. 39ff, 92ff, 189f, 378f). The effect e1 is the sinking of the Titanic at time point t1. Let to (e.g., 5 minutes before t1) be the first time point after which the sinking of the Titanic was unavoidable. So, if event eo consists in the movement of the Titanic at time to in its given environment, then eo is the most indirect but still deterministic cause of e1. On the other hand, let the event c at a time tc stand for the collision of the Titanic with the iceberg (e.g. tc is one minute before t1, i.e. before the sinking begins). Then tc is the most direct cause of e1 According to Meixner’s definition of “cause1” and “cause2”, eo as well as c count as a cause of e1. So far so good — but the problem is: every arbitrary event e* occurring temporally between t0 and t1 counts as a cause of the Titanic’s sinking, too, because it satisfies Meixner’s conditions, in particular condition (3.): for all worlds w coinciding with the real world until the first time of event e*, it will hold that it is unavoidable that e1 happens in w, and so (by irrelevant weakening) it also holds that if e* occurs in w, then e1 happens in w. (The same argument applies to Meixner’s second notion of causation, “cause2”, based on secondary events.) So according to Meixner, we can legitimately say that the captain’s laughing, or Mary’s dancing, say 2 minutes before the sinking, has caused the Titanic’s sinking, etc. — which is obviously inadequate.

On the same grounds, according to Meixner’s definition of “cause1” and “cause2” one would have to say — given a deterministic scenario — that the falling of the barometer, b, causes the storm’s coming, s, because conditions (1) and (2) are obviously satisfied, and (3) for all worlds w coinciding with the real world until the latest time point before the event b begins, i.e. before the barometer begins to fall, the fall of the atmospheric pressure has already happened (!), and hence it is unavoidable that the storm will come in such a world. In other words, both Meixner’s first and second notions of causation are vulnerable to well-known fallacies of irrelevance and pseudo-causality.

Meixner himself discusses the problem under the heading of ‘overshooting’ and ‘overcomplete’ causes (ch. 1*. 3*), but he does not distinguish these cases (which he thinks to be acceptable) from pure irrelevancies, which his model also admits. Meixner then considers a strengthening of his two versions of causation by a necessity-condition-requirement (a relevant-condition-requirement) of the following sort (pp. 36ff): . causes3 e* iff e causes1 e* and (iv) there exists at least one world coinciding with the real world for all time points t* <> (The analogous strengthening of Meixner’s “cause2” is called “cause4”.) Condition (iv) requires that e is indeed necessary to guarantee that e* obtains, given that the world is like ours up to the latest time before Te. However, as Meixner rightly observes in connection with the above Titanic-example, his new condition (iv) would rule out all events between to and t1 from being causes of e1, because in all worlds coinciding with ours until to it is already unavoidable that the Titanic will sink, and so the relevance requirement (iv) will never be satisfied for such an event — not even the collision of the Titanic with the iceberg will cause3 or cause4 the sinking of the Titanic. Of course, this is inadequate, too. But this does not show, as Meixner concludes, that the relevance-strengthened notions of causality are less important; rather, I think that it points towards an intrinsic flaw in Meixner’s explication. Meixner’s account cannot discriminate between intermediate causes (such as Titanic’s collision, or any event in the causal chain between to and t1) and pseudo-causes (such as the captain’s laughing, or any unrelated event occurring between to and t1). Meixner’s first and second notions of causality include too much, namely pseudo-causes as well as intermediate causes, and Meixner’s 3rd and 4th notion of causality exclude too much, namely intermediate causes as well as pseudo-causes.

However, I suggest that there is a simple way of repairing this flaw. One must not always fix the considered possible worlds until the latest time before the putative causal event e occurs. Rather, one should fix the common past only until the latest time point at which worlds in which the putative causal event e does not occur are still possible — for one needs these worlds to check whether the putative causal event was indeed a necessary part of the sufficient causal condition for the effect e*. This modification of Meixner’s theory would not handle all its problems, but it would enable the model to discriminate between intermediate causes and pseudo-causes.