Theories of Scientific Method

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Robert Nola and Howard Sankey, Theories of Scientific Method, Acumen, 2007, 381pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844650859.

Reviewed by Paul Dicken, University of Cambridge


The philosophy of science is certainly not without its share of first-rate introductory textbooks; yet even against such a competitive background, Nola and Sankey's Theories of Scientific Method still stands out as a valuable pedagogical addition. The themes discussed in the book will of course be very familiar to many: the book begins by drawing a number of useful distinctions between what we might call the methodology of science and the meta-methodology of the philosophy of science -- the latter being employed to justify the former -- this over-arching framework providing the backbone around which subsequent material is placed, from the problem of induction, Bayesianism and its discontents, onto the big names in scientific methodology (Popperian critical rationalism, Lakatosian research programmes, Kuhnian paradigm shifts), and ending with the more recent historical and naturalistic turns in the philosophy of science. Throughout, the discussion is fresh and lively; and the focus upon the distinction between methods and meta-methods not only helps to situate some otherwise rather abstract issues and debates, it also adds a valuable extra dimension to some familiar themes. Nola and Sankey's Theories of Scientific Method is thus an excellent textbook for undergraduate philosophy of science, and a welcome addition to the field.

The basic structure of the book -- or perhaps better, the guiding problem -- is set out in Part I. No-one doubts that science is methodological in the sense that one employs various procedures and heuristics in performing experiments, analyzing data, and so forth. The philosophically interesting sense of method comes primarily to the fore in the choice between competing theories. Can one say that, in general, one always goes for the theory with the most inductive support? Or that survives the most severe tests? Or which has the greater posterior probability? And are these methodological principles better understood as a set of values to be maximized, or a set of rules to be followed? Against these questions can be set the higher-level, meta-methodological questions as to whether or not these lower-level methods are any good; and this in turn generates the basic dilemma around which subsequent discussion is to be framed. For on the one hand, if one's meta-methodology employs the same type of reasoning as the methodology it is meant to justify, one seems caught in a circle; and on the other hand, if one's meta-methodology is distinct, then it itself will demand its own justification and a regress threatens.

This general structure is used to particularly good effect in Part II, which deals with the problem of induction. Nola and Sankey begin with an enumeration of the different ways in which one might characterize the methodology of science as broadly inductive -- from the simple case of 'more of the same' reasoning, to the various ways in which one might understand an inference to the best explanation in terms of loveliness, likeliness, and all of the rest. The hypothetico-deductive method is also included under the category of inductive methodology, on the grounds that the various problems facing a hypothetico-deductive theory of confirmation are firmly grounded within the broader problem of induction. The discussion then switches to the meta-methodological question of how one can justify a broadly inductive methodology -- or indeed, how one is supposed to answer Hume in general -- and the various solutions canvassed are all tied to the same basic dilemma: either one justifies an inductive methodology within the sciences by appeal to a higher-level, non-inductive meta-methodological principle (which will then itself stand in need of an even higher-level justification); or one justifies an inductive methodology within the sciences by appeal to a higher-level, inductive meta-methodological principle (which runs the risk of boot-strapping). And in distinguishing between the methodological and the meta-methodological, one gets a much better sense of how these strategies attempt to resolve either horn of the dilemma. In the case of reliabilism for example, one is arguing inductively about the future success of induction. But it is a higher-level, meta-methodological inductive argument for the success of a lower-level inductive methodology. Consequently, although the reliabilist must concede that he cannot know that his meta-methodology is itself reliable, the internalist must also concede that the lower-level inductive methodology actually in use in the sciences has been given just as much justification as we would demand of, say, our deductive practices. The careful distinction between method and meta-method helps to make clear to the more recalcitrant student, not necessarily that epistemological externalism is the solution to the problem of induction, but at least how it is supposed to provide any solution at all.

Part III moves to a consideration of Bayesian methodologies. The presentation strikes an admirable balance between the technicalities of the probability calculus, and a thorough-going pragmatism concerning how much mathematics one really needs to know to do the philosophy of science. The meta-methodological issues here arise largely in terms of the completeness or otherwise of a pure subjective Bayesianism. Coherence within one's degrees of belief, conditionalisation upon new evidence, and the familiar Dutch-book considerations which underlie it all, are of course justified deductively. But when one comes to assigning the prior probabilities to one's beliefs that are needed to kick-start the whole Bayesian apparatus, or indeed adding sufficient extra constraints so that the whole process also has a reasonable chance of reaching a consensus, then we are into more familiar meta-methodological problems. Again, the over-arching distinction between methodology and meta-methodology provides an illuminating framework for placing the discussion of these additional Bayesian constraints of tempering, reflection and calibration that adds a helpful philosophical context to these issues.

The real highlight of the book is Part IV where Nola and Sankey discuss the big four of scientific methodology: Popper, Lakatos, Kuhn and Feyerabend. Here the focus on meta-methodology provides a much needed extra dimension to the standard treatment of these thinkers. Frequently, introductory textbooks to the philosophy of science polarize Popper and Kuhn as extremists about scientific method, and then hold them up as piñatas to be refuted. There are of course problems in the work of all four thinkers, which Nola and Sankey duly discuss. But by focusing upon the distinction between methods and meta-methods, one is better able to place these philosophers within the broader context of the philosophy of science, and to highlight their strengths as well as their weaknesses. In the case of Popper and Lakatos there is a particularly illuminating comparison between their meta-methodological strategies: although both employ their own accounts of scientific method (critical rationalism and the methodology of scientific research programmes, respectively) as a meta-methodological tool for adjudicating between competing accounts of scientific method, Lakatos' strategy is seen to have a number of distinct advantages over Popper's. For not only does Lakatos attempt to maximize the rational reconstructing of the history of science, rather than simply maximizing agreement with Popper's idiosyncratic judgment of 'heroic' science, the methodology of scientific research programmes explicitly accommodates anomalous data, and so only needs to be 'progressive' to be successful by its own standards. Similarly, the discussion of Kuhn and Feyerabend offers a sober de-radicalisation of these frequently misinterpreted thinkers: Kuhn's framework is followed through the various paradigm shifts that constitute his own thoughts on the values of science; and Feyerabend is presented as merely an advocate for defeasibility in one's rules of methods, and something approaching a reflective equilibrium in one's scientific meta-methodology.

Part V gives a somewhat briefer overview of some of the more prominent naturalistic approaches to the issue of methodology -- focusing on Quine's naturalized epistemology, Laudan's historical/empirical approach, and some aspects of Rescher's pragmatism -- before concluding with some comments on the relevance of methodology to the scientific realism debate. Here the discussion is primarily restricted to rebutting Laudan's claim that construing the methods of science as aiming for truth is irrational since this is a goal one could never detect to have been realized. But as Nola and Sankey point out, a scientific realist can always render his position (internally) coherent by inferring the reliability of his scientific methods as the best explanation of the detectably increasing verisimilitude of his accepted scientific theories.

There are a number of themes that the more advanced student may find missing. There is for example relatively little discussion about the worthiness of the various values proposed for a scientific theory. Since the focus of the book is upon the structure of one's meta-methodological strategies rather than its content, little is said about why we should value simplicity, consistency, and so forth. There is also no discussion of how a theory of scientific method might vary between the different sciences -- does unification play a more prominent role in fundamental physics, statistical reasoning a more prominent role in the biological sciences? -- and the consequences thereof. Finally, given Feyerabend's rehabilitation for the philosophical community, it might have been worthwhile to discuss the more recent 'methodological anarchism' associated with van Fraassen's stance voluntarism whereby meta-methodological issues are framed in the context of a permissive rationality. To take an example from van Fraassen, we might distinguish between a realist and an empiricist about the natural sciences in terms of which demands for explanation they find compelling and which sorts of explanation they find satisfactory. On this model then, we very quickly derive a familiar clash of methodologies. At the meta-methodological level however -- beyond basic constraints of logical consistency and Bayesian coherence -- there is nothing to decide between them; for van Fraassen, it really does seem that anything goes. But these are all questions that go beyond the scope of the book, which is hard to fault simply on the grounds of inspiring the reader to go further. And in all other respects, Nola and Sankey's Theories of Scientific Method provides a comprehensive and thoroughly excellent introductory textbook to the philosophy of science.