Theorizing Confucian Virtue Politics: The Political Philosophy of Mencius and Xunzi

Theorizing Confucian Virtue Politics

Sungmoon Kim, Theorizing Confucian Virtue Politics: The Political Philosophy of Mencius and Xunzi, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 237pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108499422.

Reviewed by Tim Connolly, East Stroudsburg University


Confucian political theory offers a normative vision for contemporary societies that draws on concepts from thinkers in the Chinese philosophical tradition initiated by Confucius (551-479 BCE). Much of the recent work in this area is motivated by dialogue with mainstream Western political theory, focusing on questions of Confucianism's compatibility with liberal democracy. Yet as Sungmoon Kim writes in the opening pages of the book, these attempts to establish dialogue have tended to look at general characteristics of the classical Confucian tradition, giving less attention to internal debates and disagreements within this tradition.

Kim's book is devoted to a reconstruction of the different visions of Confucian governance found in Mencius (4th century BCE) and Xunzi (3rd century BCE). Mencius is known for his argument that human nature is good, maintaining that human beings have four sprouts that, if properly nourished, can grow into the full-fledged virtues of benevolence (ren), righteousness (yi), ritual propriety (li), and wisdom (zhi). Xunzi, who is sometimes compared to Hobbes, claims that human nature is bad, and emphasizes the importance of correcting ourselves through ritual. Xunzi writes:

Mencius says: people's nature is good. I say: this is not so. In every case, both in ancient times and in the present, what everyone under Heaven calls good is being correct, ordered, peaceful, and controlled. What they call bad is being deviant, dangerous, unruly, and chaotic. This is the division between good and bad. Now does he really think that people's nature is originally correct, ordered, peaceful, and controlled? (Hutton 2014, 252)

Nonetheless, Kim's book focuses as much on what Mencius and Xunzi have in common as what sets them apart. In contrast to the tendency to see Mencius as a political idealist and Xunzi as a realist, Kim argues that both thinkers possess a "shared political realism" (14) that is sensitive to the power dynamics present in political life.

The realism of Mencius and Xunzi, however, operates within a shared moral framework. In the book's introduction, Kim lays out what he calls the "paradigm of Confucian politics" (5-10), the vision of governance laid out by Confucius that provides the backdrop against which to understand the political theories of Mencius and Xunzi. He captures this framework in four propositions: the virtue proposition, which states that in order to lead flourishing lives we must cultivate virtues such as ren, attained through the daily practice of ritual; the virtue politics proposition, that sees the ruler's moral character as the foundation of governance that cares for the people; the moral education proposition, that the Confucian state must ensure the moral cultivation of the people so that they voluntarily submit to and model themselves after the care the ruler provides; and finally the material condition proposition, that the state ensures that the people have the means to support themselves.

A first aim of Kim's book is to explore the different models of Confucian politics articulated by Mencius and Xunzi from within this shared virtue framework. A second is to show how both thinkers respond to the challenge of Realpolitik that arose during the Warring States Period (475-221 BCE). As Kim points out, this period ended with the triumph of Realpolitik in the form of the tough-minded Legalist philosophy that allowed the Qin dynasty (221-206 BCE) to unify the many competing states of the time under a single rule (128). What do Mencius and Xunzi have to say for their own part about the power dynamics that shaped both the domestic and inter-state political environment of their time?

According to Kim, a fundamental concern of Mencius and Xunzi was to restrain the ruler's selfish use of power (a project he refers to as negative Confucianism)while at the same time enabling the use of power that provides for the well-being of the people (positive Confucianism). While he thinks Mencius focuses more on negative Confucianism, and Xunzi on positive Confucianism, he does not see the two approaches as mutually exclusive. "In fact," he writes, "they are two sides of the same coin of Confucian virtue politics and they combine to give rise to an interesting political dynamic that at once enables and constrains the ruler's political power" (59). Given their context in the Warring States period, Mencius and Xunzi both acknowledge that rulers are caught up in a life-and-death struggle for supremacy, and their different forms of virtue politics have important things to say about power relationships both within the state and outside it.

The arguments in the book are complex, and I want to go through them here in some detail.

In Chapter 1, Kim addresses the issue of motivation. How do we get the ruler to act in public rather than private interest? How do we cause the people to comply? In response to these questions, Kim shows how the creation of public-mindedness is a core consideration that runs throughout Mencius and Xunzi. In a well-known dialogue with King Hui of Liang, Mencius tells the King that he should not focus on profit (li), but benevolence and righteousness. But rather than relying on a strict dichotomy between self-interest and morality, Kim argues that both Mencius and Xunzi want to transform the desire for profit so that it works for the public interest in a way that profits everyone in society (57). In fact, Mencius only opposes interest when it is purely private interest with no consideration of morality or the private good, and hopes to get the ruler to "extend" his private interest so that it benefits all the people (35). Xunzi develops Mencius' concern for the creation of public interest into a concern for public order. In the recognition that civility is the foundation of such order, he emphasizes the function of ritual for transforming people into citizens. People accept the social divisions that come with ritual out of self-interest, because without the order provided by ritual there will be chaos and poverty. The ruler also submits to ritual for reasons of self-interest, since the ritual increases his authority and contributes to the long-term flourishing of the state, conditions which allow rulers "to obtain the whole world" (53).

In Chapter 2, Kim examines the two different modes of political order that Mencius and Xunzi defend in the face of the disposition toward Realpolitik that was prominent in the Warring States era. He calls these virtue constitutionalism and ritual constitutionalism, respectively. According to a tradition arising out of the Analects, moral virtue rather than lineage is the foundation of political succession. While Mencius espouses the ideal of the sage-king who rules by personal virtue, he also recognizes the reality of hereditary kingship. He ultimately defends a principle of succession based on the incumbent king's recommendation, rather than on the ruler's moral virtue or people's approval. However, he does rely on ministers of good character to restrain and even depose bad rulers, and believes that any person can rise to the rank of minister. In institutionalizing an opposition between ruler and ministers, Mencius' theory contains a heavy dose of realism (75).

Xunzi, for his part, sees the continuity of the Confucian political order as resting on ritual institutions rather than on virtuous rulers and ministers. The state endures by relying on the model (fa) of the ancient sage-kings, who used ritual traditions to enable to people to transcend their base nature and take part in moral and civic life. If a ruler violates this order, then he is to be restrained and deposed by the next highest-ranking feudal lord. While Xunzi differs in seeing the political order as founded on institutional order rather than personal virtue, Kim emphasizes that both Mencius and Xunzi, as proponents of Confucian virtue politics, believe that the best kind of government depends on both ritual institutions and the ruler's moral character (117).

In Chapter 3, Kim explores the origins of the civil order in Mencius and Xunzi. In particular, he examines how their different ideas about the state of nature lead to different conceptions of the role of the ritual in politics. For Mencius, since human beings are by nature disposed towards morality, the state of nature is merely one in which people are not fully "awakened" to their moral nature and the necessity of cultivating it. Since we already possess the "heart of respectfulness," especially in relation to our parents, we have an internal drive toward the virtue of ritual propriety, and it is by practicing this virtue that we become morally good human beings. Thus Mencius sees the traits that make us good human beings as providing a foundation for those that make us good citizens. As Kim puts it, "in Mencius' philosophical system, politics is subsumed by ethics and civic virtue by moral virtue" (101).

For Xunzi, in turn, the state of nature is one of disorder and conflict. He understands lias a set of ritual institutions that the sage-kings developed in order to deal with the chaos that results from the limitlessness of human desires. Whereas for Mencius civil order arises from cultivating our innate disposition towards ritual propriety, for Xunzi the ritual institutions are a political achievement. "Externally motivated, socially required, and aimed at good political order," as Kim puts it, "ritual propriety in the Xunzian civil state is primarily civic in nature" (103). Even in the well-ordered state, Xunzi sees human unsociability as an ongoing problem, and ritual institutions preserve the political order by helping to promote civility in social interactions. His commitment to what Kim calls a "Confucian principle of civility" (109) means that conflicts are mediated by persuasion rather than force.

Chapter 4 attempts to illuminate further Mencius' theory of negative Confucianism by looking at it as a response to Realpolitik. As Kim has already explored in Chapter 2, Mencius wants to institutionalize a rivalry between the ruler and virtuous ministers. Developing this view in the present chapter, he argues that Mencius sees the king and ministers as "completely different kinds of beings" (130). While the ideal of sage-king is a key part of the Confucian tradition, Mencius' response to the violent power struggle between Warring States rulers is to "decouple" sagehood and kingship. The realization of one's sagely capacities becomes the goal for every common person, while the king's self-glorification is seen as tyranny that must be limited by cultivated ministers. The virtuous minister is placed above the king, and is given sanction to criticize the latter if he goes astray. This right to criticize is upheld by ritual and Kim sees it as an invention of a kind of Confucian political liberty.

In Chapter 5, Kim turns to the response of Mencius and Xunzi to the "Way of the Hegemon" (badao), a method of statecraft that relies on force and thus contrasts with the "Kingly Way" (wangdao) that is the ideal of Confucian virtue politics. While Mencius imposes a strict dichotomy between the Confucian way and any other, he also recognizes that the Way of the Hegemon is superior to tyranny. Xunzi follows up on this idea, defending the Way of the Hegemon as a "reasonable mode of moral statecraft" (157) that contrasts with the Realpolitik put forth by other Warring States philosophers. What makes the Way of the Hegemon moral is its establishment of "trust" (xin), a fundamental Confucian virtue, between the ruler and his subjects. While the Hegemon relies on punishment and reward, rather than personal virtue and moral education, the goal is to establish peace, security, and material well-being. Kim argues that Xunzi's defense of the Way of the Hegemon resonates with Confucius' own ideas, for the founder of the tradition also recognizes that effective statesmanship is not always the result of personal virtue.

Finally, in Chapter 6, Kim addresses the "global vision" of Mencius and Xunzi. If Confucian virtue politics ultimately aims at creating a community that embraces "all under Heaven" (tian xia), how is it possible to realize this aim in a world populated by competing sovereign states led by ambitious and violent rulers? In response, Mencius and Xunzi both emphasize the need for rulers to feel responsible for the good of people living outside the boundaries of their own borders. This leads them to advocate a notion of humanitarian intervention, in which military force against another state is justified when it is advanced by rulers of good character who are motivated by care for people being harmed through tyranny or foreign aggression.

In the conclusion of the book, Kim argues against the idea, recently defended by Loubna El Amine, that the Confucian standard of success in politics depends on the establishment of order, and that this standard is independent of virtue. El Amine argues "that the central motivating principle of Confucian politics is political order, and that rulers who are able to achieve a minimum level of order, are approved of, even if they are not virtuous" (El Amine 2015, 62). By contrast, Kim underscores that his book has intended to show how Mencius and Xunzi attempt to "strike a balance . . . between virtue and political order" (216), while remaining strictly with the paradigm of Confucian virtue politics.

In reading this book, my attention was drawn to aspects of Mencius and Xunzi, and the connections between their ideas, which I previously had overlooked. Kim does an excellent job of showing how in spite of their commitment to a virtue-based framework, both thinkers are sensitive to the power dynamics that shape the political structures around them. Virtue ethics is sometimes accused of naivete in its claim that the virtues are central to human flourishing, and the accusation becomes more pressing when we try to extend considerations of virtue into the political realm. While I did experience the occasional worry about this line of criticism while reading the book, mostly in relation the discussion of virtue-based humanitarian intervention in Chapter 6, I found the book to be an overall success in showing how considerations of morality and power are intertwined in the ideas of Mencius and Xunzi.

Here I want to raise one issue for further discussion concerning this balance. The issue concerns the connection between the ruler's virtue and effective statesmanship. As noted above, in Chapter 5 Kim maintains that Confucius and Xunzi, in contrast to Mencius, both acknowledge "the possible incongruence between one's personal moral character and one's great and benevolent political achievements" (174). Confucius, for instance, praises the minister Guan Zhong (720-645 BCE), who was able to achieve enduring political benefits while at the same time lacking in personal virtue. Xunzi in turn says that "There are some who, even though virtue is not yet completed in them . . . nevertheless order and control for all under Heaven advances under them." (175)

To make sense of this "practical chasm" (175) between personal virtue and effective governance, Kim involves his distinction between strong virtue monism and tempered virtue monism. The former, which he attributes to Mencius, maintains that there is a complete accord between the ruler's personal virtue and his civic and political virtue. The latter, which Kim associates with Confucius and Xunzi, "weaves personal moral virtue and good political consequences . . . in a non-straightforward way" (175). He uses these terms to elaborate a key distinction between Mencius and Xunzi (19-20), while at the same time emphasizing that they both see the ruler's personal virtue as the foundation of good governance, thus differentiating his view from those such as El Amine's.

However, one might think, at least from the example of Guan Zhong, that the distinction between strong virtue monism and tempered virtue monism contains a wider degree of difference than Kim acknowledges. While he describes the latter view as "weaving" virtue and effective politics "in a non-straightforward way," what is striking in the case of Guan Zhong is the gap between the two. This figure's ruling style does not blend the political with the personal; rather, Confucius' praise of Guan Zhong is puzzling precisely because the latter is limited in his moral character. Without some further discussion of the "non-straightforward" manner in which virtue and statesmanship are connected, I was left in doubt about how tempered virtue monism helps us make sense of cases such as Guan Zhong.

However, here I am not registering an objection so much as a curiosity to learn more about Kim's views on this issue. I hope that this carefully argued, contextually attuned, and conceptually engaging book will lead to much more discussion about how thinkers in the tradition of Confucian virtue politics approach issues of power and self-interest.


Thanks to David Elstein, Eirik Lang Harris, and Hagop Sarkissian for their comments on part of this review.


El Amine, Loubna. 2015. Classical Confucian Political Thought: A New Interpretation.Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Elstein, David. 2017. "Classical Confucian Political Thought: A New Interpretation, by Loubna El Amine" [Review]. Philosophy East and West 67, no. 3: 917-919.

Harris, Eirik Lang. 2016. "Xunzi's Political Philosophy." In Dao Companion to the Philosophy of Xunzi, edited by E. L. Hutton. New York: Springer.

Harris, Eirik Lang. 2019. "Relating the Political to the Ethical: Thoughts on Early Confucian Political Theory." Dao: A Journal of Comparative Philosophy 18: 277-283.

Hutton, Eric L., trans. 2014. Xunzi: The Complete Text. Princeton: Princeton University Press

Kim, Sungmoon. 2016. Public Reason Confucianism: Democratic Perfectionism and Constitutionalism in East Asia, Cambridge University Press.