Theorizing Justice: Critical Insights and Future Directions

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Krushil Watene and Jay Drydyk (eds.), Theorizing Justice: Critical Insights and Future Directions, Rowman and Littlefield, 2016, 197 pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781783484041.

Reviewed by David A. Reidy, University of Tennessee


Introducing this edited collection, Krushil Watene says that it aims first to gather some critical insights into the broadly Rawlsian tradition in political philosophy and then to present some new issues that may require alternative points of departure or new frameworks of thought if progress is to be made in our thinking about them. While this does not suggest a great deal of topical or methodological unity, it still suggests more than is delivered by the papers that follow. Nevertheless, most of the papers are informed, insightful, stimulating and useful. As a whole, however, the volume neither sheds much light on the future of the Rawlsian tradition nor generates much momentum behind any alternative orientation. Its main value lies elsewhere.

Watene's introductory chapter attempts to convey briefly the landscape of contemporary work in or in reaction to the broadly Rawlsian tradition. Unfortunately, it is too brief and sometimes too misleading to enable readers to situate the chapters that follow. Readers would have been better able to engage each of the four essays in Part One ("Critical Insights"), for example, had Watene's introduction more effectively conveyed the following dimension of Rawls's ambition.

Rawls's work was primarily responsive to the question: what can we, politically speaking, reasonably hope for? It aimed to work out the content of an ideal to which, as both rational and reasonable, our allegiance and agency might be drawn in a developmental process. Rawls described his efforts on this front as contributing to ideal theory. He recognized that they largely left unaddressed the question: Given our current situation, what can we do now, politically speaking, to help usher in that for which we can reasonably hope? To answer this question is to contribute to what he dubbed non-ideal theory. Though often perceived as more immediate because they engage the world as it is right now, questions of non-ideal theory were for Rawls best raised and answered only after we had some confidence that our agency might be sustained and oriented over time by a more or less determinate reasonable hope. Accordingly, in his own work he found time to address only a few of the most pressing of such questions: toleration of the intolerant, civil disobedience, just war and humanitarian assistance.

In her essay, Colleen Murphy raises an important non-ideal theory question: How should we deal with the immediate past when moving from a social world marked by serious and large-scale injustices to one substantially closer to what we can reasonably hope for? This is the question of so-called transitional justice. Surveying extant approaches to it, Murphy argues, first, that those that aim to balance competing backward (corrective and retributive), present (distributive) and forward (reparative and restorative) looking considerations of justice in a context sensitive fashion are incapable of delivering more than unprincipled and ad hoc answers that ignore important distinctions within the idea of justice. She then argues, second, that those oriented by only forward-looking considerations of restorative or reparative justice are not well-tuned to the diverse contexts of transitional justice, contexts within which forgiveness may sometimes be inappropriate, punishment may sometimes be appropriate and restorative or reparative justice may compete with distributive justice. She then makes a case for treating transitional justice as a distinct species of justice, the principles of which would presumably explicate a reasonably well-defined class of considered non-ideal theory judgments. Unfortunately, she indicates neither how we are to identify such judgments in a non-circular fashion nor how we are otherwise to arrive at such principles.

Tim Mulgan draws attention to the fact that Rawls's work, in both ideal and non-ideal theory, presupposes a world within which, given the right institutions, it is possible not only to meet the basic needs of all persons but also to maintain for them across generations a decent if not steadily improving quality of life. He then asks: What if the world was such that regardless of institutional arrangements it was not possible to meet the basic needs of all or to ensure that future generations were at least as well off as present? Rather than asking what would happen to our moral psychology in such a "broken" world, Mulgan explores from various theoretical perspectives -- contractarian, contractualist, libertarian, utilitarian, and so on -- the "justice" of establishing within it a survival lottery. For this reader, at least, it was hard to see the point. Inquiries into life-boat ethics have value only insofar as the life-boat situation is a rare and transient or localized (as with, say, the distribution of vital organs for transplant) occurrence rather than our permanent and universal condition. Were it to become the latter, then the first (and perhaps only) questions to ask would be psychological, not moral, or at least not justice-oriented.

Rehearsing arguments from his 2009 monograph The Idea of Justice, Amartya Sen argues that we are ill-served by trying, with Rawls, first to determine what we can reasonably hope for, before asking what we should do now to move ourselves closer to justice. But he largely addresses himself to a strawman version of, and endorses positions already endorsed by, Rawls. Sen writes as if Rawls understood himself, on behalf of philosophy, to be handing over the blueprint, stolen from the vaults of eternal law, for the construction of a just social world. Though familiar, this is a caricature. To be sure, Sen is correct that, in the same way a person may be able case by case repeatedly to compare and choose the better of alternative courses of action without being oriented by a complete life plan, so too we may be able case by case repeatedly to compare and choose the better of alternative institutional arrangements without being oriented by a complete social ideal of the sort Rawls articulates and defends. But Rawls surely understood this. The question, then, is: Why did Rawls think it important for persons to have or produce over time a more or less complete life plan, and for peoples to have or produce over time a more or less complete social ideal? Sen fails to shed light on these questions.

Mozaffar Qizilbash begins by noting that, as a moral theory, utilitarianism is complete in ways that neither Rawls's justice as fairness nor Sen's or Nussbaum's capability oriented approach to justice is. This, he suggests, makes it difficult to determine the extent to which Rawls, Sen or Nussbaum has offered a genuine alternative to utilitarianism. Unfortunately, the essay succeeds largely in demonstrating only what most readers already know: first, that there are various ways to fall short of the completeness of utilitarianism (indeed, because completeness has many dimensions, utilitarian theories are not themselves all equally complete) and that Rawls, Sen and Nussbaum each set aside any aspiration for a "theory" as "complete" as utilitarianism and instead address themselves each to a different problem in a different way.

Part Two ("Future Directions") contains five essays. Jay Drydyk asks an unfamiliar non-ideal theory question: Who should we welcome as allies in our political activities aimed at improving justice? He draws on the tradition of virtue ethics to frame his response, concluding that in selecting allies we should look both comparatively and sometimes categorically to a number of factors across different dimensions -- motivational, procedural, deliberative and consequentialist. Though he does not put the matter thus, what he offers is a sensible framework for the cultivation of active civic friendship under non-ideal conditions.

Thom Brooks urges theorists to pay more attention to a stakeholder principle of justice that would confer on all those with a stake in the resolution of a particular issue a voice in the process of resolving it. Of course, as Brooks acknowledges, the general thought here is as old, and as in need of further specification, as republicanism. Rather than specifying the general thought, or looking to theorists like Carol Gould who have tried to take it seriously, he instead indicates how once brought to the surface within Rawls's political liberalism or incorporated into the capabilities approach of Sen and Nussbaum it might add to their appeal.

Krushil Watene asks what it would mean for contemporary political philosophy to take seriously the independent standing and self-determination of indigenous peoples. Reviewing Will Kymlicka's and James Anaya's work, she finds that both end up drawing indigenous peoples into a conversation framed by ideas of independence and self-determination foreign to them. Undertaking to engage with what they think and say about their independence and self-determination, she explores a metaphor indigenous peoples often invoke in this context: independence and self-determination as the restoration and reinvigoration of essential capacities -- for caring, sharing, guardianship, planning, action and growth -- through the healing of relations, between persons, peoples, and with nature, broken long ago.

Stacy Kosko examines the ways in which international law tries but often fails adequately to respond to the vulnerabilities of certain sorts of ethnic minority and indigenous populations to political injustice. After reviewing familiar failures with respect to the implementation and the normative content of international law in these areas, she focuses on less familiar and undertheorized failures of group recognition and classification. To highlight the ways in which international law can not only misfire here, but can also generate counterproductive incentives for, and grant easily abused discretion to, states, she examines the status under international human rights law of the Roma people in Europe. The Roma are especially vulnerable to serious political injustice but generally unrecognized in Europe as an indigenous people, a national minority or an immigrant population and so without any special protection under international law. This is a paradigm of what Kosko dubs a "recognition gap."

In his excellent contribution, Rutger Claassen argues that liberals need to rethink their readiness to accept a preference-utilitarian approach to market failures and to market regulation. Classical liberals, whether emerging from the utilitarian or the natural law tradition, permit market regulation for the sake of aggregate preference satisfaction or public goods when markets fail on either front. But they prohibit market regulation for the sake of civil or political rights. Of course, this privileging of economic over civil and political rights smacks of libertarianism, and libertarianism generally precludes market regulation for the sake of aggregate preference satisfaction or public goods. To avoid being driven toward libertarianism and to remain consistent with their commitment to civil, political and economic rights as co-equally foundational to justice, classical liberals should acknowledge that the reason they permit market regulation for the sake of aggregate preference satisfaction or public goods is not because they identify justice with states of affairs within which preference satisfaction is maximized, but rather because they identify it with respecting persons. Respecting persons entails taking seriously or crediting their freely expressed preferences, so long as so doing is consistent with respecting persons generally. But then, Claassen maintains, the classical liberal can take a preference-utilitarian approach to market failure and market regulation only so long as she is confident that her doing so is consistent with preserving the civil and political rights of all.

Modern or high liberals, whether emerging from the British idealist or the Rawlsian tradition, permit market regulation for the sake of not only aggregate preference satisfaction and public goods but also more fundamental demands of justice -- not only political and civil but social and economic. The modern or high liberal has, then, even more reason than the classical liberal to resist a preference-utilitarian approach to market failures and market regulation. The classical liberal takes the preferences of persons seriously when thinking about market failure just so long as doing so is consistent with respecting and preserving their civil and political rights. But the modern or high liberal takes them seriously only so long as they are formed and expressed against just background social conditions -- not just political and civil but social and economic. The modern or high liberal should, then, be even more reluctant in regulatory policy discussions to adopt a preference-utilitarian approach to market failure.

Claassen urges liberals to adopt a multidisciplinary approach to market failures and market regulation oriented around autonomous agency. For classical liberals, persons are assumed to have the capacity for autonomous agency. For modern or high liberals, they are assumed normally to acquire it if background conditions are just. Thus, classical and modern or high liberals will continue to disagree over the nature of market failure and parameters of permissible market regulation. But both will agree that markets fail and market regulation is warranted in cases missed by the preference-utilitarian approach dominant now in economics and regulatory policy circles. Given that libertarians too have no reason to embrace this approach, it is remarkable that its dominance has not drawn, heretofore, more critical attention.


Thanks to my colleagues Adam Cureton and Jon Garthoff for helpful comments on a previous draft of this review.