Theory and Practice in Aristotle's Natural Science

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David Ebrey (ed.), Theory and Practice in Aristotle's Natural Science, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 261pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107055131.

Reviewed by Mor Segev, University of South Florida


In recent decades Aristotle's scientific treatises, particularly his biological works, have received renewed attention. This focus has been accompanied by an investigation into the connections between these writings and other parts of his corpus, primarily, though not exclusively, the Posterior Analytics. Both of these developments are responsible for 'making this a very exciting time in Aristotle scholarship', as David Ebrey puts it in his introduction (2). The contributions to this volume continue both trends, raising new relevant issues, and addressing, broadening and modifying existing ones. The chapters are divided thematically into three parts: 'Matter', 'Teleology' and 'Methodology'. Below I provide a synopsis of each chapter but confine my critical remarks to a limited number of chapters from each part.


In 'The "matter" of sleep', Alan Code provides a fresh account of the material cause (or, as it turns out, the analogue of that cause) of sleep in Aristotle's theory. Based mainly on a reading ofMet. H.4, Code argues that, in Aristotle's view, natural non-substances, though they lack matter strictly speaking, nevertheless have causes functioning as matter, i.e. they have matter-analogues. A matter-analogue is understood as a subject underlying an affection (caused by an agent-analogue and leading to the possession of a certain form-analogue). In the case of an eclipse, also discussed in H.4, that underlying subject is the moon whose light is being destroyed by the earth coming in the middle of the moon and the sun (cf. 1044b12-15). Similarly, according to Code, Aristotle views the matter-analogue of sleep as the primary organ of perception (in blooded animals, the heart), which is periodically immobilized by partially digested nutriments so as to temporarily block off perceptual activity.

Code's account is supposed to improve upon previous interpretations which do not take the material cause of sleep to be an underlying subject of an affection. Robert Bolton, for instance, has argued that the material cause of sleep in De somno is 'the necessary massive return of cooled material to the region of the heart'.[1] However, Bolton's account does have an obvious advantage (as do others), which Code himself recognizes (n. 63): it conforms to the paradigm of hylomorphic explanation which Aristotle seems to adhere to in DA I.1, 403a29-b9, where he uses the example of anger, which is roughly defined there formally as 'desire for revenge' and materially as the 'boiling of blood around the heart'. Code suggests that the account of the matter-analogue of sleep in Met. H.4 should ultimately impose 'restrictions on the candidates for matter and form in the interpretation of other attributes common to body and soul', such as anger in the DA I.1 passage (34). It is understandable, of course, that Code could not elaborate on this point in the scope of this chapter. However, it should be noted that in order to fully oppose alternative views, Code must convincingly show that DA I.1 could indeed be read as accommodating a material explanation of psychophysiological attributes along the lines which he proposes. However the issue would ultimately be resolved, Code's discussion has the unchallengeable merit of focusing our attention on the relation between the Metaphysics and the De anima and Parva Naturalia on the issue of the material explanations of psychophysiological attributes.

In 'Are facts about matter primitive?', Jessica Gelber argues that, contrary to various scholars, Aristotle does not regard facts about matter, such as facts about 'the bodily blend or krasis of elemental powers in an organism's blood (or the analogous substance in non-blooded organisms)' (49), as explanatorily primitive. First, she argues that basic facts about matter cannot be explanatorily primitive in Aristotle's theory since such facts are in fact explained teleologically, e.g. in PA II.1 (51). Second, she appeals to the fact that, according to Aristotle's theory, there is a regular correlation between a fact about matter, viz. that human blood has a high degree of heat, and a fact about soul, viz. that human beings are intelligent. She then argues that intelligence is certainly an essential feature of human beings for Aristotle, and so the fact that humans are intelligent must be explanatorily primitive in his view. But if the fact about the high degree of heat in humans were similarly primitive, then the regular correlation between these two facts would turn out to be coincidental. Therefore, Aristotle cannot consistently take the fact about matter in question to be primitive as well. Third, Gelber shows that Aristotle in GA in fact discusses basic material features of living things (e.g. heat and cold) as tools used by their souls, which again suggests that facts about matter are subordinate to facts about soul, and are therefore not primitive, in his view.

Gelber focuses on matter at the level of the krasis of blood since she thinks it is 'the strongest candidate for being a primitive fact about matter' (49). But one could argue that there is another fact about matter in Aristotle's theory which is even more likely to be primitive than facts about 'the differences in the proportions of the elemental powers composing' blood (ibid.) and furthermore would remain unaffected by Gelber's arguments. I have in mind the basic fact that living beings have blood (or something analogous to it) at all, which James Lennox, in one of the papers Gelber wishes to criticize, calls primitive 'in two senses: [i] In blooded animals the maternal and paternal contributions to generation are already concocted blood of a certain sort, and [ii] blood (or its analogue) is the nutritive matter of the entire body'.[2] Furthermore, though the particular composition of the matter giving rise to animal parts may not be primitive according to Aristotle, but rather conditionally necessitated by functions to be performed by the organism, as Gelber suggests, there is still room for viewing certain other facts pertaining to matter of that kind or composition as being primitive for him. Again following Lennox, the amount of such materials (e.g. the earthen material conducive to the production of defensive parts) present in an animal does seem to be primitive, or 'given', for Aristotle (which is why he thinks, for instance, that the formal nature of horned animals produces horns at the expense of teeth which would have been formed using the same materials).[3]

In 'Blood, matter and necessity', Ebrey argues that the notion of material necessity in Aristotle's PA needs to be reevaluated in light of the following facts. First, matter in PA usually refers to blood, which, as that which 'nourishes, constitutes and grows' animal parts, is 'quite open to possibility' and 'on its own . . . does not necessitate any particular action' (64-5). Second, the explanations from necessity in PA encompass a variety of senses of necessity (including the necessary result given the operation of an efficient cause on matter; the necessary occurrence of a natural feature given the essence of an organism; and conceptual necessity). He argues that, given this variety of senses, it would be wrong to simply contrast teleological explanations in PA with explanations from material necessity. Aristotle himself, Ebrey says, lumps together the various kinds of explanation from necessity under the same category (presumably thereby himself leading to the confusion above) because his discussion focuses on introducing teleological explanation as an improvement on his predecessors.


In '"And these things follow": teleology, necessity, and explanation in Aristotle's Meteorologica', Margaret Scharle argues that, despite the lack of teleological language in the Meteorologica, teleology may play a role in that work. In Aristotle's biology (in particular, in PA), a basic fact which is explained teleologically (viz. that man generates man) in turn explains further phenomena, some teleologically (e.g. the production of certain biological features) and some non-teleologically (e.g. the presence of useless residues as leftovers from biological processes). Similarly, in Aristotle's meteorology, a basic fact which is explained teleologically (viz. that there are originative cycles of water-air and earth-fire) in turn explains further phenomena (which form the subject matter of theMeteorologica), though in this case only non-teleologically (since the elements themselves are passive and part-less).

In 'Aristotle on the cosmological significance of biological generation', Devin Henry attributes to Aristotle a teleological view which occupies a midway position between global teleology (à la David Sedley)[4] and organism centered teleology by admitting some natural phenomena as being for the sake of 'the good of the universe as a whole' (102). Henry thinks that continuous biological generation is such a phenomenon, an idea which he bases on his reading of GA II.1 in conjunction with GC II.10. In GC II.10, 336b25-35, Aristotle says that since (i) nature always strives for what is better, and since (ii) being is better than non-being, and since (iii) individual sublunary beings are incapable of persisting eternally, (iv) continuous generation exists, which enables the closest approximation to eternal being (in the sublunary realm). Henry interprets the passage as suggesting that continuous generation occurs because it contributes to that state which is 'the best way for the universe to be' (n. 20). But is there a sound basis for this interpretation? Certainly, the two general principles from which Aristotle 'deduces [his] conclusion' (108) ((i) and (ii) above) need not support Henry's reading. As he recognizes (100-1), Aristotle in fact associates principle (i) with what is best for (the essence of) each kind of organism (cf. DI II, 704b15-17). As for principle (ii), merely stating that 'being is better than non-being' says nothing conclusive about what or whom being is better for. In order to make his point, then, Henry needs to positively show that in 336b25-35 Aristotle speaks of the good of the universe as a whole as being the final cause of continuous biological generation. But Aristotle in this passage only mentions the universe in saying, 'metaphorical[ly]' (108), that 'God . . . filled up the universe by making generation perpetual' (Henry's translation). Nothing is said of the best state for the universe to be in. As we shall next see, Thomas K. Johansen shows that we need not appeal to the good of the universe as a whole in interpreting this passage from GC II.10, contra Henry.

In 'The two kinds of end in Aristotle: the view from the de Anima', Johansen argues that, of the two senses of telos distinguished by Aristotle himself in several places (viz. end as an aim, or 'end-genitive', and end as a beneficiary, or 'end-dative'), the end-dative plays a much broader role in Aristotle's teleology than has been previously recognized. For example, in DA II.4, 455a26-b7, Aristotle brings up the distinction in the context of the presentation of his idea that the natural end of biological reproduction lies in enabling mortal living things to partake of eternity. Far from seeing the distinction between the two senses of end in this discussion as signifying the rejection of the end-dative in favor of the end-genitive, Johansen reads it as signifying a serious attribution of both senses of end to the case at hand: reproduction is for the sake of a share in eternity (as end-genitive) and the sake of the biological species sharing in eternity through the reproduction of its members (as end-dative).

Johansen's suggestion is useful for responding to a key point in the previous chapter by Henry. Henry reads this passage from DA II.4 as being simply concerned with the need of individual organisms to reproduce in order to share in eternity (111). He then contrasts his reading of this passage with GA II.1 and GC II.10, which he thinks focus on the good continuous biological reproduction and generation have to contribute to the universe at large (111-12). But, since on Johansen's reading of the DA II.4 passage the teleological explanation of reproduction includes the good it has for the species as a whole, we need not resort to cosmological teleology of any kind in order to explain the phenomenon. Extrapolating from DA II.4 to GC II.10 (and thereby to GA II.1), we could say that in formulating or applying his principle that 'being is better than non-being' in the context of his discussion of biological reproduction Aristotle focuses on being as better for the biological species whose members continuously reproduce.

Johansen also elaborates on the occurrences of the distinction between the two senses of telos in Physics II.2 (with regard to human beings as being an end 'in a way' [pōs]) and DA II.4, 415b8-22 (with regard to the soul as being the end of its instrument -- the body). He goes on to apply the distinction to several cases. He discusses Wolfgang Kullmann's work on Aristotle's view of the teleological significance of materially necessitated biological features (having no 'end-genitive', in Johansen's terminology),[5] and my own work on the psychological corollary to these cases in Aristotle's view of dreams,[6] and extends the analysis to further phenomena such as other cases of phantasia (which he takes to be similarly lacking an end-genitive of its own). As Johansen recognizes, it is important to appreciate the (sometimes crucial) teleological significance Aristotle ascribes to natural phenomena which do not themselves come to be for any distinct natural purpose, and Johansen's paper advances this aim by reevaluating the conceptual framework and reviewing particular cases in the light of it.

According to Christopher Frey in 'Two conceptions of soul in Aristotle', two methods of inquiry into souls which Aristotle apparently uses (investigating the soul's proper activities and objects, and examining the end for the sake of which the soul's activities are carried out) yield two distinct and seemingly incompatible conceptions of soul (soul as a structure of capacities, and soul as nature). Frey argues that we need to embrace the conception of soul as nature as primary in order to successfully reconcile the two conceptions. On this view, souls form a hierarchical structure, in which the highest type of soul (say, the perceptual soul of a non-rational animal) exists energeiai and the lower types of soul (in this case, the nutritive soul) exist only dunamei (this is illustrated e.g. by an analogy with Aristotle's view in GC of the ingredients in a mixture as existing dunamei). The hierarchical relation between soul types (or 'ways of living') is supposed to be superior to other proposed relations, such as the focal or analogical relations. By way of brief criticism, Frey's view implies, as he says, that a perceptual soul (say) could only exist energeiai while having the nutritive soul in it dunamei (159). If this is to be extended to rational souls as well, it would suggest that rational souls could not exist energeiai either without having perceptual and nutritive souls existing in them dunamei. But there is then the obvious exception of Aristotle's conception of the souls of certain divine and celestial beings (which certainly lack nutritive souls), which need to be accounted for, especially since Frey himself brings them up as a counterexample in criticizing the attribution to Aristotle of a 'focal relation' view of the unity of the soul (153).


Aristotle calls both politics and metaphysics 'the most architectonic science' (in the Politics and Metaphysics respectively), which seems inconsistent. In 'Aristotle's architectonic sciences' (163-86), Monte Ransome Johnson proposes a hierarchical ordering of the sciences on Aristotle's behalf. According to his proposed model (introduced after a discussion of Plato's Politicus as relevant background), politics is subordinate to the theoretical sciences, including metaphysics, which is concerned with the good at a higher level of generality than the practical sciences and supplies the end for the sake of which politics itself is pursued (170). Johnson finds evidence for this hierarchical view e.g. in the Protrepticus (170-1,179;cf. Protr. 6.37.11-22, 10.54.22-56.2). He argues further that, despite Aristotle's rejection of 'kind-crossing' in scientific explanations (cf. A.Po., I.7), subordinate sciences rely in providing explanations for their proper phenomena on (inter alia) principles and axioms taken from the higher sciences. Johnson concludes with an example of such a reliance based on Aristotle's Politics I.1-2, which he interprets as employing a metaphysical principle as well as facts of natural science in order to explain facts in natural history (e.g., that male and female must or should combine, a fact which supplies one of the relations at the basis of the natural structure of thepolis in Aristotle's theory).

Now, Johnson admits that his examples from Politics I.1-2 of (alleged) demonstrations of the kind he is interested in are still 'experimental' and 'do not as yet get us very far into Aristotle's political science' (185). He also notes, following Bolton, that the metaphysical principle on which these demonstrations are supposed to be based (namely, that 'those which are incapable of existing without each other must unite as a pair') is 'dubious' (184 and n. 19). To these points I might add the following concern. Johnson says that 'we should at least attempt to relate Aristotle's political science to the method of his Posterior Analytics if at all possible' by discovering 'practical syllogisms that . . . explain certain actions, laws, or constitutional structures on the basis of ethical, economic, or political theorems . . . [which] will in turn have to be demonstrated on the basis of natural scientific and theoretical principles' (185-6). But it is difficult to imagine how this could be done if even the examples from Politics I are only of limited use for Johnson's purposes. Should we expect the other books of the Politics (whose connection to Book I is a controversial issue in itself) to exhibit a systematic employment of practical syllogisms backed up by natural theory and theoretical (say, metaphysical) principles? In any event, Johnson should provide a clearer explanation of the way in which his vision is to be carried out, and in particular which texts would yield the view he is propounding.

In 'Varieties of definition', Sedley takes up the controversial question of whether or not Aristotle endorses definitions lacking existential import, viz. merely nominal definitions. He argues that even the chapter which allegedly provides the strongest evidence for Aristotle's endorsement of such definitions, viz. A.Po. II.10, has 'nothing to do with any theory of 'nominal definition'' (198). He does so by showing that, on Aristotle's list of definition types in that chapter, the item which appears to stand for 'nominal' definitions in fact coincides with the item standing for 'non-causal' definitions (corresponding to the conclusions of deductions). Sedley's arguments in support of this claim include a discussion of DA II.2 but center on Physics IV.7, 213b30-214a4, where Aristotle introduces two definitions of void. Since Aristotle rejects the existence of void, he should presumably ascribe to it a nominal definition, but in that text he rather presents definitions of void as the conclusions of deductions (viz. non-causal definitions). And these, Sedley continues, cannot be nominal definitions since, for Aristotle, void is definable because it is in a sense something real. In particular, void is the 'matter, qua such, of the heavy and the light' (195; cf. 217b21-8). In fact, according to Sedley, any definition which Aristotle accepts turns out to correspond in some way to reality, which is why Aristotle can confidently assert that it is absurd (atopon) to expect there to be definitions of nonexistent things (196; cf. A.Po. II.7, 92b26-30).

In 'Empty words', Sean Kelsey looks into Aristotle's evaluation of some of his predecessors as propounding empty words. Kelsey begins by surveying evidence from the ethical works (EEI.6; NE X.9) and concludes that Aristotle charges the users of empty words with a lack of proper education and experience, which renders such people incapable of (even an attempt at) practicing philosophy. In their inexperience, resembling that of children, the empty talkers can only pretend to be, or play at, philosophizing, even when they themselves are persuaded by their own pretensions. Finally, Kelsey applies his interpretation of Aristotle's criticism of 'empty talk to various criticisms found in his scientific writings. For instance, the Eleatics, Kelsey says, are criticized by Aristotle for following their arguments up to the point of abandoning the obvious facts about the very reality which these arguments are supposed to explain (cf. GC I.8, 325a19-25). In the field of biology, with which Kelsey seals his discussion, Aristotle is similarly shown to criticize those who contend that all fish are male (GA III.5, 755b22-756a4), those who think that fish conceive from swallowing the seed (758a8-ff), and the Empedoclean view of sexual differentiation as occurring in the womb due to the hot and the cold (GA IV.1), for disregarding observable facts out of childlike incompetence resulting in 'empty talk'.

In 'The scientific role of Eulogos in Aristotle's Cael II 12', Andrea Falcon and Mariska Leunissen argue, contrary to other scholars, that Aristotle consistently appeals to what is reasonable (eulogos) for the purposes of his natural inquiry, and not only for dialectical purposes (though, in their view, dialectic itself can function as a part of scientific inquiry for Aristotle). In particular, Aristotle appeals to what is reasonable in order to provide an approximate explanation of phenomena for which the empirical evidence is either altogether lacking or insufficient, based on already established scientific principles or on evidence of parallel or analogous cases. Thus, for instance, Aristotle explains that eggs are more likely to be spoiled in heat due to their yolk being mixed, which is reasonable to assume based on an analogy between eggs (whose yolk is 'earthy') and wine (whose sediment is 'earthy' as well) (GA III.2, 753a23-7). Falcon and Leunissen explain Aristotle's appeal to what is reasonable in Cael. II.12 along the same lines: given the remoteness (both perceptual and conceptual) of the heavens, we lack the proper resources needed for fully explaining the motions of the heavens and for explaining away certain aporiai generated by the numerical disorder in these motions (230). However, we might explain away the apparently disorderly motion of the heavens by appealing to what is reasonable to assume about these motions using an analogy with phenomena in the sublunary realm, for which we have much more evidence. Aristotle concludes, based on this analogy, that there is an order to the motions of the heavenly bodies after all (though not a numerical order, but rather a biological-axiological and/or teleological one). So here, too, Aristotle appeals to what is reasonable for scientific, as opposed to merely dialectical, purposes.

The contributions to this volume open up new and interesting directions in the study of various issues pertaining to Aristotle's natural science (e.g. his biology, psychology and meteorology) and its relation to other areas of his thought (e.g. his metaphysics, theory of definition, ethics and politics). Indeed, several contributors, including Code, Johansen and Johnson, consciously present their chapters as starting points for such future inquiry. Readers who are interested in these issues are encouraged to become acquainted with this book. Hopefully, future engagement with its contents, both supportive and critical, would prolong this 'very exciting time in Aristotle scholarship' (Introduction, 2).


p. 88: κατά ί τὴν τάξιν → κατά γε τὴν τάξιν (cf. Meteor. I.9, 347a5-6).

p. 140: φανερὠτερος → φανερώτερος. Also, φανερώτερος should be translated as 'more obvious', rather than as 'most obvious'.

p. 140: κίνησις ἡ κατὰ τροθὴν . . . → κίνησις ἡ κατὰ τροφὴν . . . (cf. DA II.2, 413a24-5).

p. 152: κοινὸν λόγος . . . → κοινὸν λόγον . . . (cf. DA II.3, 414b25).

p. 164: θεορετική → θεωρητική.

p. 166: by Water's text → Bywater's text.

p. 217: οὐκ ἀλόως → οὐκ ἀλόγως.

[1] R. Bolton, "The Material Cause: Matter and Explanation in Aristotle's Natural Science," in W. Kullmann and S. Föllinger (eds.), Aristotelische Biologie: Intentionen, Methoden, Ergebnisse(Stuttgart, 1997), 97-126, 104-5.

[2] J. Lennox, Aristotle's Philosophy of Biology (Cambridge, 2001), 186.

[3] Ibid. 193-5; cf. PA III. 2, 663b36-664a2.

[4] Henry also offers some criticism of global teleology, which I cannot comment on here.

[5] W. Kullmann, 'Different Concepts of the Final Cause in Aristotle', in A. Gotthelf (ed.), Aristotle on Nature and Living Things (Pittsburgh, 1985), 169-175.

[6] M. Segev, 'The Teleological Significance of Dreaming in Aristotle', Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 43 (2012), 107-141.