Theory of the Border

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Thomas Nail, Theory of the Border, Oxford University Press, 2016, 275pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190618650.

Reviewed by Avery Kolers, University of Louisville


The first thing to understand about Thomas Nail’s profound book is that the first word of the title is neither modified by an adjective, nor introduced by an article. This is neither a normative nor an explanatory theory of the border, but a laying bare of the structure of border regimes, much as music theory lays bare the structure of musical works without explaining or evaluating.

The second thing to understand is that the last word of the title also takes no adjective. State borders are only one kind of border, and a recent kind at that. Fundamentally, borders are inflection points where flows change direction. Any social construct — fence, wall, passport, browsing history — that changes people’s movements is part of the social kinetics of borders.

It follows from this definition that borders are not about stopping things from moving, they are about movement itself. Border theory is, then, not an account of walls and fences but is a “social kinetics” or “kinopolitics”:

Kinopolitics is the theory and analysis of social motion: the politics of movement. Instead of analyzing societies as primarily static, spatial, or temporal, kinopolitics or social kinetics understands them primarily as regimes of motion . . . In this sense it is possible to identify something like a political theory of movement. (24)

We also tend to think of borders as enclosing societies or states that are analytically and temporally prior to their borders. Nail insists that the reverse is true. It is by bordering that societies take shape; borders create societies. Hence the book “is a history of social formations, including states, as the products of the bordering process” (15).

Nail first gives a schematic overview of border theory, or social kinetics, and then applies this theory to four historically significant bordering strategies: the fence, characteristic of Neolithic societies; the wall, characteristic of ancient cities; the cell, characteristic of the medieval period; and the checkpoint, which arrives with the modern state. These four, though emblematic of different historical eras, are not mutually exclusive; and the book concludes with a discussion of how each strategy is implicated in the US-Mexico border enterprise.

Nail’s purpose is

to provide an analysis of four major material border techniques during their period of historical dominance and to provide a conceptual, movement-based definition of them . . . it is meant to be a philosophical history that extracts from empirical history the concepts sufficient to elaborate a critical limology useful for contemporary analysis. (15)

Nail’s book — a companion volume to his The Figure of the Migrant (Stanford, 2016), which is a study of the “pedetic force” of people on the move — is exceptionally systematic and structured. It introduces a great deal of new terminology, from its subject matter (kinopolitics or social kinetics: “the theory and analysis of social motion: the politics of movement” (24)) to its method (critical limology: “the theory of the real conditions for the production of borders” (14)), to many of its core insights (e.g. the “kinopticism” of the police patrol, as against the “panopticism” of the guard tower (124)). And even where the words themselves are familiar, Nail’s theory, initially at least, unfolds at a schematic level that requires understanding how borders can be and do what he says they are and are doing. Ultimately, by showing “that borders have no ahistorical or universal social necessity and are thus open to further change or destruction,” Nail hopes to help usher in a reimagination of what borders could be — “of the types of social alternatives possible” (16-17).

The book begins with a conceptual theory of the border. Borders are always in motion. He begins with a kinopolitics — “a political theory of social motion” — that characterizes all social motion in terms of three “core concepts”: flow, junction, and circulation (24). Flows are continuous processes of movement — think of a river — which intersect and intermingle with other flows. Everyone is caught up in multiple social flows all the time. Borders do not stop flows, but redirect them, change their speed, and so on. They do this at junctions. A junction redirects “a flow back onto itself in a loop or fold” (27). Although borders are always in motion, the junction gives the border the illusion of stasis; but this stasis is only relative to the flows that it redirects. Junctions are social “points of relative stability in a sea of turbulence” (28), and hence are socially necessary. Junctions such as houses let some people circulate within but cause others to recirculate. Finally, circulation “connects a series of junctions into a larger curved path [that] continually folds back onto itself, wrapping up all the junctions together” (28).

With these three “core concepts” in hand, Nail analyzes borders per se, or specifically, “bordered expansion by expulsion” (31). Expansion is not merely the enlargement of state territory; nor is expulsion merely deporting someone beyond the bounds of that territory. Rather, expulsion occurs whenever someone or something loses a “socially determined status,” including by suffering economic deprivation. Similarly, expansion occurs whenever the society gains “territorial, political, juridical, [or] economic kinopower” (34), for instance by gaining jurisdiction over a commodity through production or import. What is key to borders is that they distinguish who may be or go where; they offensively assert power and defensively announce the intention to defend; they compel flows (of people and things) inward and outward.

Consequently Nail identifies four “social motion[s] or function[s] of borders,” the first of which is “to mark a bifurcation point in a continuous flow” (36). Every border is a continental divide in its own right. Marking has two aspects, first to violently do damage to something (such as breaking the Earth to mark a spot, or marking a human body) and second to leave a trace or memory that announces whose act of “march[ing] out and back around on itself” has expanded into this zone (36). Nail describes an ancient Greek practice of departing in procession from the center of settlement out to Hera’s sanctuary, then around the perimeter. The marchers would lead an ox with a sacred plow that would dig a furrow the whole way of the march; and hence the territory would be marked (36-37).

The mark leaves behind a limit, which is the second social function of the border. If marking is offensive because it breaks the earth and expands control, limiting is defensive because it “protect[s], defend[s], and enforce[s]” the zone. Yet the fact that the mark remains and is defended does not mean it is impermeable. To the contrary, the third social function of the border — the boundary — “bind[s] or compel[s] part of the outside to the inside” (39). Some things pass through, some things turn back. The boundary compels things to move in one or another of these ways (39-40). Hence there is a “triple motion of the border that is required for the production of society: expulsion, compulsion, and expansion” (39).1

Having laid out the three core concepts (flow, junction, and circulation) and the three essential motions (expulsion, compulsion, and expansion), Nail embarks on Part II of the book, “Historical Limology.” Here he traces the history of four types of border technologies or regimes, finding the “transcendental conditions” — but not causal explanation — of their emergence at different points in history2: the fence (Chapter 2), the wall (Chapter 3), the cell (Chapter 4), and the checkpoint (Chapters 5-6).

These chapters bring together phenomena both familiar and unfamiliar in a genuinely new way. The work is a philosophical anthropology of borders through “Western” history, from the Neolithic when, by “settling down,” people enact “the first kinopolitical event” (48), up through contemporary “kinometric system[s]”:

with the invention of fingerprinting technology, kinographic information appeared on everything the mobile body touched. The body itself became the infographic record of its own mobility, like the slime trail of the snail. (160)

Our trajectory through cyberspace is, if anything, even easier to trace. Contrary to the myth of globalization as having ushered in a world without borders, in fact we have more, and more kinds of, borders than ever before.

Nail concludes by analyzing the US-Mexico border in terms of the four historical border regimes. This section is divided into four short chapters: the US-Mexico fence (Chapter 7), wall (Chapter 8), cell (Chapter 9), and checkpoint (Chapter 10). The overall aim is to “analyze the US-Mexico border kinopolitically. That is, . . . as a technology of social circulation.” (166)

Donald Trump has capitalized upon and cemented a vision of the US-Mexico border as a fence or wall, a static blockage that attempts, unsuccessfully, to stop people from crossing. But this is the kind of view Nail is concerned to reject outright. Not only does Trump misunderstand borders per se and the US-Mexico border — “the most frequently crossed boundary in the world” (167) — in particular; Trump’s characterization is even a lie about the purpose of the fence and the wall. Fences and walls serve in part to funnel people towards the border: “the US-Mexico border fence functions centripetally to capture migrants from Mexico and keep them in the United States” (176), both as a cheap and often rightless labor force, and as detainees earning the Corrections Corporation of America $200 per bed per night (176-177). But this funneling also kills; ever since the militarization of the border began in earnest — the same year NAFTA came into effect — the US has expanded and fortified fences and walls near and through major cities. Consequently, traffic has bottlenecked at official ports of entry, making it impossible to inspect those who attempt to cross; while at the same time, unauthorized migrants have been pushed into the countryside. The rate of apprehension has dropped precipitously, while at least 6000 migrants have died crossing.

* * * * * * * * *

Modern borders are the modulation and management of these two kinds of flows: securitized flows to be slowed and detained, and economic flows to be sped up and facilitated. They are two sides of the same border regime. (219)

This book is genuinely new and profound. In this respect it is a model of the best that philosophy can do. It takes something that is right in front of our faces, that we think we understand, and reveals it to be utterly different from what we thought, thereby giving us the capacity to see it anew and, we hope, without illusion.

Unfortunately, Nail’s writing is less transparent than it could be; the sheer buildup of neologisms is only the beginning of it. More importantly, there are places where it is not fully clear that the analysis hangs together. Two particularly significant points are the claim that borders are prior to society, and the inclusion under the same headings of so many different kinds of movement and points of directional change.

The priority of borders to society is intended to repudiate the contrary, and perhaps more widely held, view that society is prior to the border.

Movement cannot be explained by spatiotemporalization. . . . The border is not the result of a spatial ordering, but precisely the other way around — the spatial ordering of society is what is produced by a series of divisions and circulations of motion made by the border. (9)

This is a false dichotomy. Borders and societies are mutually formative. Trying to assert the priority of one to the other generates confusion. In trying to say that the border precedes spatial orderings, Nail smuggles in a preexisting “spatiotemporalization,” for instance when he refers to the “territory” of hunter-gatherers, which precedes the bordering activity of sedentary farmers who expel them (22). Later he says that “‘settling down’ is the first kinopolitical event . . . . Without settlement, social motion simply follows the flows of wild game and weather patterns” (48). This distorts relatively sophisticated territorial strategies of nomadic peoples into a kind of prehistory — dare we say a “kinobiology” — that is different in kind from kinopolitics.

Second, although Nail wants to avoid creating a theory of everything and nothing — “If, as Etienne Balibar states, ‘borders are everywhere,’ then they are also nowhere” (10) — his account attempts to encompass a staggering diversity of kinds of movement and demarcation. Some of this movement is literal, but some is metaphorical — change in status, change in rights, change in property relations. By the end, borders are indeed everywhere. Passports are borders (96) that allow bearers, whose bodies are borders (99), to pass through walls and checkpoints, which are borders; but once every authority has begun issuing letters and passports, these documents become “indistinguishable from a formal tax on mobility” (96). More than the fact that borders are contained within borders that cross borders, it may be this “indistinguishable” that threatens to send the analysis spilling beyond its bounds.

Finally, it is worth noting that the book is a work of “critical limology,” and it is not clear how relevant it will be to normative theorists of migration and immigration. The moral outrage that suffuses Part III, on the US-Mexico border, is grounded in basic empathy; it does not rely on the theoretic apparatus of the book. Indeed that theoretic apparatus offers no normative judgment — nor, to be sure, is that its goal. The relevance to normative theorists may then be to force an admission that border regimes are more malleable and variable than is normally recognized. Consequently, those who justify immigration restrictions by appeal to considerations such as freedom of association have more work to do: they must show that freedom of association is compatible not just with borders per se but with a particular kind of border regime. Contrariwise, those who defend “open borders” may need to think through whether this aim is even conceptually possible, and if it is, whether it would not be undermined by other kinds of borders that could even turn out to be more brutal and exclusionary than our contemporary territorial enclosures.

1 The leading edge of this “process of continual motion” is the fourth function of the border, namely the frontier (40). Frontiers are neither static nor necessarily exterior. Nail leaves extended discussion of the frontier for the companion volume, focusing in the current volume only on marking, limiting, and bounding.

2 Strictly speaking, Nail is aware that he here presents border regimes from “Western” history. This is intended critically — to expose “a certain lie of stability and fixity” about the West — but he also announces an intention to expand the analysis with future studies that will more effectively “overcome the perceived superiority of Western culture” (223).