Theory vs. Anti-theory in Ethics: A Misconceived Conflict

Placeholder book cover

Nick Fotion, Theory vs. Anti-theory in Ethics: A Misconceived Conflict, Oxford University Press, 2014, 334pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199373529.

Reviewed by Nora Hämäläinen, Helsinki Collegium for Advanced Studies, University of Helsinki


Nick Fotion strives to formulate a "new theory of theory formation in ethics" by revisiting the conflict between theorists and so-called anti-theorists in late 20th-century and contemporary (mainly analytic) ethics. This is a misconceived conflict, he argues, because both parties have an overly restrictive idea of what moral theory is or should be. In Fotion's view, both anti-theorists and those who have answered them by defending theory understand theory in terms of what he calls strong theory: a type of theory that is defined by a range of demanding criteria that few actual theories fulfill. Instead of continuing the debate (or forgetting it, which has mostly been the case), he suggests that we should see it as an opportunity to come to a more reflective understanding of what theories are, can be and should be in ethics.

Moral theory, when conceived of in terms of strong theory, is, in Fotion's terminology, generally expected to provide a means for organizing our moral views. It should also provide justification for those views, and generate moral norms. It should give an account of the procedure by which we obtain (adequate, accurate) moral norms, and the norms generated should be universalizable. A theory should further, according to the strong theory model, be complete, that is, capable of dealing with all ethical problems. It should also attempt to be privileged, that is, aiming to win over, or be preferred over, or compete with other theories, and last, it should (strive to) be irreplaceable as a true account of morality.

A substantial part of the book is dedicated to going through a range of rather different theories or approaches in ethics, with an eye on how they answer to this list of requirements. These approaches include, among other things, just war theory, exceptions theory, feminist theory, Rawls's theory of justice, T. M. Scanlon's contractualist theory, Michael Slote's and Rosalind Hursthouse's virtue-ethical theories, and Timothy Jackson's theological ethics. And indeed, as Fotion observes, most moral theories, even typical and canonical specimens of analytic moral theory, actually fail to live up to at least some of the requirements. Some, like just war theory, fail by being local, that is, by applying only to situations of war or threat of war. Rawls's theory, though broader in scope, similarly applies only to questions of justice, primarily within a liberal setting, and thus equally fails in relation to the requirement that a theory in ethics should be complete. And so on. Fotion's conclusion, roughly, is that most actual moral theories available are both incomplete and complementary. Academic ethics, as it stands, does not provide us with "strong" master theories. It offers rather a broad range of plausible but partial theories that can help us along in structuring and reflecting over our moral norms and moral lives. These are what Fotion calls weak theories. He argues that a viable theory of theory in ethics must discard the requirements of completeness, privileging and irreplaceability from the picture of what a moral theory is like, while the other requirements more or less remain in place. As a more flexible and tolerant view of theory, a paradigm of weak theory would, supposedly, disarm the anti-theorist critiques of the past three or four decades of (broadly) analytic moral philosophy.

A benefit of Fotion's book is his exposition of differences in the aims, scopes, ambitions and guiding problems of various moral theories and frameworks. His ideas of how different theories can be partners, rather than competitors, in our search for moral understanding is further quite in line with contemporary theoretical sensibilities, and is likely to elicit broad sympathy. But there are two, interrelated, large issues in the book that demand closer critical scrutiny. The first is his staging of the theory/anti-theory debate; the second is the (mostly implicit) suggestion that his theory of theory would resolve the central questions involved in this debate. I will briefly address these two issues in turn.

To begin: who exactly are all those people who have equated theory with strong theory, so as to make it the dominant idea of theory in contemporary ethics? This is never stated in the book, although its polemic strategy rests on this assumption. On the theory side Fotion mentions at the very outset Richard Brandt, Alan Donagan, Ronald Dworkin, David Gauthier, Alan Gewirth, Jürgen Habermas, R. M. Hare, Rawls, and Slote, several of whom are explicitly discussed in the book as theorists who do not formulate strong theories. Among anti-theorists Fotion initially mentions are Annette Baier, Alasdair MacIntyre, Cheryl Noble, Charles Taylor and Bernard Williams, but for the most part the anti-theorists are referred to in the abstract and general, attributing to them a variety of positions that do not resonate very well with the work of these mentioned thinkers.

On the theory side the requirements listed by Fotion have certainly been voiced and sometimes followed, but they have also been criticized and selectively flouted by theorists. They form thus a list of possible demands that can be and have been presented concerning the form and scope of moral theories, rather than an agreed upon list of requirements. So-called anti-theorists certainly have criticized all of these requirements, and some anti-theoretical formulations suggest a strong theory idea of what ethical theory is. Examples of this are found early on in this anti-theory debate: Williams's critique of theory as a "decision procedure for moral reasoning" (Williams 1981: x) or Peter Winch's critique of theory as a "calculus of action" (Winch 1972: 153). Yet, the critiques directed towards theorizing in ethics in the past decades are by no means limited to what Fotion calls strong theory.

This is something that Fotion is quite aware of, judging from the way he describes the critical emphases of the anti-theorists. In his view their position mostly boils down to a particularist stance, that human situations are too different to be subsumed under a normative moral theory, and a cultural relativist stance, that cultures are too different to be subsumed under one and the same normative moral theory. Formulated in these terms, the anti-theorist position would imply at least a critique of the idea that moral theory should generate norms, and substantial restrictions to the idea of universalizability. As Fotion himself formulates the anti-theorist's joint position, it is not the case that the demands of strong theory would be their central issue. Their misgivings about theory have to do with features that are present in Fotion's notion of weak theory, too.

An additional and more interesting question is whether Fotion understands his anti-theorist opponents well enough. Both the particularist point and the cultural relativist point are certainly to be found in the work of the people he lists as anti-theorists, but they give, as such, a rather impoverished idea of the substance of the critiques presented by the thinkers he does mention as anti-theorists. The first, particulartist claim sounds like the particularism of Jonathan Dancy (whom Fotion discusses) and Wittgensteinian thinkers like D. Z. Phillips or Winch (whom Fotion does not discuss). The particularist discussion accounts merely for one strand of anti-theory: a skepticism concerning the habitual role attributed to generalizability in ethics. The second, cultural relativist stance resonates better with the cultural inquiries of MacIntyre, Taylor, Baier and Williams. But summed up as a cultural relativist credo, it gives an outright misleading idea of the point of pursuing cultural inquiries instead of normative theories in ethics.

Philosophers like MacIntyre, Taylor, Baier and Williams do not emphasize the conflict between the unity of theory and variety of moral views and frameworks (which Fotion takes to be one of the central challenges in ethics), but are rather concerned with how all of our conceptions (theoretical as well as non-theoretical) rest on culturally contingent understanding, of which we, as moral philosophers, often do not know quite enough. The meaningful way to move to what Fotion calls "the critical level of thinking" in ethics is, thus, according to these thinkers, not by presenting coherent and plausible normative theories, but by trying to better understand existing frameworks, the ones that we and others live by. As Baier (1985: 224) put it "we philosophers need to work with anthropologists, sociologists, sociobiologists, psychologists, to find out what actual morality is; we need to read history to find how it has changed itself, to read novels to see how it might change again." Far from being an intellectual capitulation in the face of complexity, this is a completely different vision of what kind of knowledge will bring helpful clarification.

It should also be remembered that the rejection of normative theories along the lines described by Fotion's strong or weak theory does not imply discarding theory in all forms. Many of the thinkers who discard normative ethical theory in the sense intended by Fotion do substantial theoretical work and use theoretical concepts to achieve critical clarity in ethics. Taylor's notion of strong evaluations and Williams's influential use of the idea of " thick and thin moral concepts are two cases in point. Fotion notes, indeed, that all anti-theorists have generalizing, systematic (theoretical?) commitments on the meta-ethical level, e.g., concerning moral language. But he doesn't account for the possibility that theoretical concepts and tools are put to work in rather different ways outside the realm of generative, action guiding, and normative theories. The very label of anti-theory has in fact never been widely embraced by so called anti-theorists, much because it suggests a negation and a void, where there is really an affirmation of a wide range of quite different intellectual and theoretical pursuits.

Fotion's failure to account for the deeper motivations of many anti-theoretical philosophers is not without consequences for his ability to assess more specific questions in these thinkers' work. When addressing Taylor's critique of moral theories focused on obligation and the right, Fotion takes Taylor's point to be that such theories are incomplete (in the sense that they neglect fundamental questions of the good and personhood) and retorts by saying that this kind of incompleteness does not affect the validity of the things such theories have to say about the right. But Taylor's point is not that theories focused on obligation or the right are incomplete, but that they in fact do rely on a notion of the good that is rendered invisible to the theorists themselves, through the liberal credo that separates the right from the good. The right they manage to articulate is not the universal right they purport to talk about, but rather an articulation of right within a historically contingent framework of value, concerning which the theorists are insufficiently self-reflexive and self-critical.

Summing up, Fotion contradicts himself in claiming that the theory/anti-theory debate is premised on an over-focus on the idea of theory as strong theory, since this picture is disconfirmed by his discussion of the anti-theorist's views. His treatment of anti-theorist critiques is further formulated by sidestepping or missing out on what the deeper concerns of the mentioned anti-theorists are. Thus, his attempt to formulate a more flexible meta-theory for ethics remains, in the end, external to the theory/anti-theory debate, suggesting a fairly conservative list of requirements for normative moral theory.

Yet, setting the anti-theoretical sensibilities aside for a while, it is beyond doubt that moral theory needs a bit of meta-theoretical scrutiny. If one remains quite sure, all things considered, that presenting normative, action guiding theories is a worthwhile pursuit in moral philosophy, it is not unlikely that a meta-theoretical picture like Fotion's could help one navigate between different theories and outlooks, complementing one's contractualist view with an Aristotelian notion of eudaimonia, for example. Against this background it comes as a surprise that Fotion chooses to close with a moral argument for weak theory, stating with moral emphasis that it is more tolerant than strong theory. He more or less ends up claiming that weak theory is the meta-theory of nice and reasonable people, while strong theory is the meta-theory of dogmatic people, who are so impressed by their own constructs that they cannot see the benefits of other people's work. This sounds like Fotion eventually would find himself unsure of the philosophical merits of weak theory (its capacity to help us think critically and knowledgeably about morality) and would resort to moralizing over people who have a different meta-theoretical perspective.

In fact it seems to me that some version of weak theory could very well be defended purely on epistemic grounds, as a more efficient path to knowledge or insight. Yet, Fotion makes its prospects look unnecessarily weak by suggesting that one overarching theory would be preferable to several complementary ones, if such a theory could be obtained. Weak theory is the tolerant solution as things stand. Thus, there remains, at the heart of his book, the dream of a perfect theory, which would also be the perfect picture of the true morality.

On a few occasions, beginning with page 1, Fotion compares theories in ethics to theories in the sciences, supposedly the natural sciences. This is usual but notoriously unhelpful, since natural scientific theories are the ones most dissimilar to moral theories that you can find in academic research. More useful points of comparison would be found in the theories that guide qualitative research in the social sciences, or that you find in literary theory, aesthetics or the theory of historiography. Attention to these kinds of theory would reveal that theories really can be of very different kinds, and both traditions of thought and the objects of inquiry have various kinds of impact on what sort of theorizing is locally meaningful. Fotion makes a good effort of highlighting the benefit of theoretical plurality, but ends it prematurely by suggesting a theory that effectively excludes most varieties of theoretical thinking in ethics beyond the analytic paradigm of normative ethical theory.


Baier, Annette. 1985. Postures of the Mind: Essays on Mind and Morals. London: Methuen.

Williams, Bernard. 1981. Moral Luck. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Winch, Peter. 1972. Ethics and Action. London: Routledge and Kegan Paul.