Therapeutic Action: An Earnest Plea for Irony

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Lear, Jonathan, Therapeutic Action: An Earnest Plea for Irony, Other Press, 2003, 246pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 1590510771.

Reviewed by Gregg M. Horowitz, Vanderbilt University


In Therapeutic Action, Jonathan Lear addresses his fellow psychoanalysts about a range of topics that are also of core interest to his fellow philosophers: the structure and development of human subjectivity, the possibility and place of objectivity in psychoanalytic theory and practice, the force of love, and, insofar as one species of love, transference love, is the engine of the dialectical expansion of human attachments, love’s role as a condition of human being-in-the-world. Lear’s engagement with the Heideggerian topos of the mutual openness of persons and worlds helps him to develop the main themes of this book in ways that deepen the achievements of his earlier texts on the philosophy of psychoanalysis. Therapeutic Action is thus essential reading for philosophers interested in the significance of psychoanalytic experience and theory for a more complete understanding of the self-reflexivity that is the metier of mindedness. But Lear’s book should also prove stimulating for philosophers of all stripes, for its driving question - “How might a conversation fundamentally change the structure of the human psyche [for the better]?” (3) - is close kin to the unending problem of what philosophy has to offer to ethical life beyond a persistent re-entrenchment of skepticism. Lear’s answer, foreshadowed in the subtitle ’an earnest plea for irony,’ is that some types of ironic conversation, of which the psychotherapeutic conversation is exemplary, do the meta-skeptical work of holding together conflictual fragments of psychical life at a level of mental organization which makes possible the tolerance, and perhaps even the use, of cognitive and affective dissonance. “Higher organization consists in part in the capacity to regress, to play, to make loose associations - ironically, to give up structure. What higher organization does require is that when one does give up structure, one has not thereby lost it. One has the capacity to come back … Analysis needs to be understood as enhancing this capacity, which, among other things, is a capacity for irony” (121).

As Lear spells out the value of this power of irony, it becomes clear that by irony he has in mind a trope utterly distinct from sarcasm. In fact, if by sarcasm we mean the aggressive inflection of words that makes them mean the opposite of what they ordinarily mean, then irony, Lear urges, is the opposite of sarcasm. In ironic speech we use words to mean exactly what they say, but with the crucial proviso that words may always be saying more than we take them to on first hearing. A first hearing, of course, can be limited by a number of factors, but sometimes it is the habits and prejudices that make a hearing first that are themselves the obstacles to listening well. First hearing, in other words, is sometimes first filtering, in which case we need to suspend our ordinary auditory commitments to get at the extra significance borne in speech. This capacity to listen while ’losing’ a bit of interpretive structure takes us straight to Lear’s central claim: psychoanalysis achieves its therapeutic ends by means of a conversation in which the analyst listens ironically to the speech of the analysand, hearing in it that the analysand is actually saying things that he (the analysand) is not himself hearing. Meanwhile, the analysand develops through the conversation the capacity to listen ironically to himself;. “the analytic process,” Lear writes, “is thought to consist, at least partially, in a process by which the analysand comes to internalize the capacity for analysis” (97). This scenario of mutual ironizing entails that there is an overarching irony to the total analytic situation that neither analyst nor analysand controls: the analyst’s capacity for ironic listening depends on his not taking himself to have any special knowledge to offer the analysand (once the analyst knows what the analysand really means, he has stopped listening to what the analysand is saying), and so on a self-ironization of his status as medical expert while, on the analysand’s part, the initiation and development of the capacity for self-ironization depends on his taking the analyst’s expertise to be a presumptively good reason to be talking to him, rather than to, say, the bartender. At least part of the successful internalization of analytic capacity must be, then, the development of the analysand’s ability to use the analyst’s ’expertise’ to dissolve the reflexive belief in the existence of experts in the matter of how to live.

From this perspective it is easy to see why, for Lear, psychoanalytic conversation echoes two main features of Socratic inquiry: it listens for the aspirations which are both expressed and concealed in what speakers actually say, and it disables doxastic expertise by orienting critical inquiry to what can only be overheard. In other words, the psychoanalytic conjunction of hearing, ironizing, and healing resembles philosophical dialectic in the sense that part of learning how to do dialectic is learning how hard it is to tell the difference between it and mere defensive logic-chopping. As Lear says, “Psychoanalysis stands to … hypnosis and other forms of suggestion as philosophy stands to sophistry … Indeed, figuring out the difference between philosophy and sophistry is itself part of the therapeutic action of philosophy” (35). However, Lear implies that the parallels between psychoanalytic and philosophical therapy extend beyond their shared interest in breaking up doxastic fixations to a shared concern with why such fixations develop to begin with. In this regard, Lear takes special aim at the medicalization of psychoanalysis as an especially disastrous defensive fixation of the practice (one wonders what Lear thinks of the comparable professionalization of philosophy!). Taking itself to be a branch of modern bio-medicine, psychoanalysis came to privilege the mastery of a body of theoretical concepts above responsiveness to psychical distress as the basis for therapeutic practice. Lear argues that this legitimation is philosophically unsuitable, but his more pressing criticism is that the primacy of extra-clinical conceptual mastery serves psychoanalysts as a defense against listening to what their patients are trying to say - against, that is, their own practice. In a Wittgensteinian-genealogical vein, Lear writes, “The entropy of thought is not a problem that can be completely avoided. It is endemic to thinking itself. Even the phrase ’entropy of thought’ can become a cliche. So, too, can warnings to avoid it. So, the task for us is to bring our concepts to life” (34).

Lear unpacks his commitment to bringing concepts to life by arguing that the aim of a psychoanalytically informed critique of concepts is not to craft better concepts but rather to get into a better relation to conceptuality. ’Defense,’ ’transference,’ and ’the unconscious’ are forged in the crucible of psychoanalytic experience, which is to say in the conversation between doctor and patient. They are tools for the analytic handling of what the patient presents. Although psychoanalytic concepts, like all concepts, may then become the subject matter of a second-level reflection on their cognitive adequacy, the proper ’therapy’ for the entropy of thought requires a renewed encounter with the experience that needfully gave rise to the concepts in the first place. “Its no good just saying that psychoanalytic life is a life of inquiry … and not a life-asserting doctrine. This is just one more assertion of doctrine. Somehow the understanding must be embodied in the activity of communicating” (26). The ’life’ of concepts that must be communicated is the needfulness of psychoanalytic conversation. ’Back to the rough ground’ is Lear’s rallying cry.

Notwithstanding the force of Lear’s call for a genealogical recollection of the original energy of conceptualizing, there is something unreflectively idealistic about Lear’s concept of ’life,’ something that imports into his view of therapeutic action a perspective that is too Fichtean and insufficiently Freudian - too cheery and insufficiently ironic. Note that ’to bring (back) to life’ can mean to animate, after the fashion of Victor Frankenstein’s trick with his monster. But if the entropy of thought really is endemic to thought itself, then something in a thoughtful relation to the world is also properly deadening to life (a lesson Shelley’s doctor learned too late). Lest this seem to sound a morbid note, let it serve as a reminder that thinking of ’life’ as the only proper destination of conversation ignores the ways in which the conversational withdrawal from life, expressed most extremely in the striving for conceptual fixity, is sometimes a salutary refusal of excessive stimulation and aimless activity. Such withdrawal can represent, in other words, a critical repudiation of ’wrong life.’ A Wittgensteinian treatment of concepts which shies at tarrying with the moment of lifelessness in concepts will thus run the risk of falsifying the dialectic of life and thought.

That this danger should threaten one of our most masterful explicators of psychoanalysis calls for explanation. One culprit, I suspect, is Lear’s identification of ’life’ with the ceaseless activity of the subject. This core idealist trope is all over Therapeutic Action, but here is a prime instance as Lear begins his ’primordial’ definition of subjectivity.

Let us say that a concept is subjective if it names a certain kind of subject … Lover is a subjective concept in the sense that someone who loves is constantly in the process of shaping herself into a person who loves. She is constantly in the process of becoming a certain kind of subject. This is an unending project … There is no end to the ever-deepening complexity - or simplicity - of the project. Should one get to an end, all this can mean is that one gets stuck (37-38).

Not only does Lear here seem to have conflated logical and practical ends - itself an aim of Fichtean idealism - but, further, in his tarring of subjectivity with the task of ceaseless self-becoming, one cannot help but hear dreadful super-egoistic condemnations of the adequacy of every given shape of subjectivity. Freud and many other psychoanalysts, it seems to me, are not primarily interested in the activity of the self, but in the array of forces and projects that are lived out by the subject and which, because not lived in the realm of self-assertion, go unrecognized as part of minded life. And it is this emphasis on the limitations and blindnesses that constitute subjective life, and not on its endless striving, that mark Freud off from the great nineteenth-century idealists. Indeed, from a psychoanalytic point of view, ’constant activity by the subject’ sounds like a symptom of a bad relationship between a person and something that, while incompatible with his sense of his psychical borders, is nonetheless unavoidable for him; since what is unavoidable and yet disunifying is ’the unconscious,’ which is to say the world inside the subject, ceaseless self-activity must be the mark of an insuperable conflict between the subject and his world. In emphasizing how ambivalence and conflict stain us all the way up the ladder of our cognitive and cultural achievements, Freud remained attuned to the mutual openness of persons and their worlds; but he did not, I think, see psychoanalysis as a technique for aiding human beings to attain the sort of autonomy that the frantic self-shaping subject of idealist philosophies was supposed to secure.

I do not mean to suggest that Lear thinks it the task of therapeutic action to resolve all the conflicts between persons and the world, for that would express a demand to adapt to the world Lear has done so much to criticize. Nonetheless, his idealist concept of subjectivity colors his view of conflictual life with a meliorist tone that is altogether too friendly to the one-sided view of psychoanalysis as helping people complete the project of autonomy. Consider Lear’s statement about the meaning of termination in analysis:

In the case of a complete analysis, it is not that there are no more conflicts, but that one is in a position to understand actively, in one’s living, what those conflicts are. One is able to take some action with respect to them, and above all, one is able to avoid being lived by them … The process of actively and understandingly living with one’s conflicts … is itself the life of becoming a certain kind of subject … It is something that is always fresh, always beginning. It is only when one gets trapped by one’s conflicts that things get old, that one starts to go dead as a subject (96-97).

This is a masterfully ambivalent expression of openness to and repudiation of the unconscious dimensions of life. If a conflict is a spur to action or thought, and conflicts are not to be thought of as eliminable from life, then the conclusion is inevitable: life is too stimulating. To be alive, in other words, is not to escape the ’trap’ of one’s conflicts. The entire logic of entrapment and autonomy is inappropriate for grasping subjective life as built up out of material it cannot master, and if becoming a subject is, as Lear says, always a fresh beginning, that can only be because the subject is an agent of forces s/he will never finally understand actively. Indeed, it might even be that a commitment to autonomy must be seen as a form of self-denial, and psychoanalysis as the invaluable conversation for disclosing the internal connections between what is internal to life and what external to it. The ironies, at least, remain unending.