There's Something About Mary

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Peter Ludlow, Yujin Nagasawa, and Daniel Stoljar (eds.), There's Something About Mary, MIT Press, 2004, 480pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0262621894.

Reviewed by Alex Byrne, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


It is a picture of another windowless, cell-like room, but crowded with furniture and equipment -- a desk, filing cabinets, bookshelves, computers, and a TV set. Everything is painted in black and white or shades of grey, including the young woman who sits at the desk. She wears black gloves, black shoes, opaque black stockings, and a white lab coat. The image on the TV screen is monochrome. But the room is built underground; above the surface, shown in cross-section, is a smiling pastoral landscape, full of brilliant colour.

'That's Frank Jackson's Mary, the colour scientist. The idea is that she's been born and raised and educated in a totally monochrome environment. She knows absolutely everything that there to know about colour in scientific terms -- for example, the various wavelength combinations that stimulate the retina of the eye in colour recognition -- but she has never actually seen any colours. Notice there are no mirrors in her room, so she can't see the pigmentation of her own face, eyes, or hair, and the rest of her body is covered. Then one day she's allowed out of the room, and the first thing she sees is, say, a red rose. Does she have a totally new experience?'


'That's what Jackson says. It's another argument for qualia being ineffable and irreducible.'

'It seems like a good one to me.'

'Well, it's better than most. But again the premise asks you to accept an awful lot. If Mary knew absolutely everything there is to know about colour -- which is much, much more than we know at the moment -- maybe she'd be able to simulate the experience of red in her brain. By taking certain drugs, for example.'

David Lodge, Thinks…1

There's Something About Mary is a collection of twenty essays on the knowledge argument. Jackson's "Epiphenomenal Qualia" and "What Mary Didn't Know" are included, together with three later papers ("Postscript", "Postscript on Qualia", and "Mind and Illusion"), the latter two of which explain why Jackson now disavows the argument. Most of the essays will be familiar; only four of them have not appeared elsewhere (by David Chalmers, Benj Hellie, Philip Pettit, and Robert Van Gulick) and only two of those (Hellie's and Pettit's) are completely new. Stoljar and Nagasawa have contributed a lengthy and very helpful introduction, which would be appropriate to assign to undergraduate classes. The introduction is alone worth the price of the volume -- and is available for free at There is a comprehensive bibliography at the end, updated at The whole package is nicely put together, and anyone interested in the philosophy of mind will find this a useful volume to own.

Here is one way of setting out the knowledge argument, slightly adapted from Stoljar and Nagasawa's adaptation of Jackson's formulation in "What Mary Didn't Know":

(1) Every physical truth is such that Mary (before her release) knows that truth.

(2) Mary (before her release) does not know every truth (because she learns a truth on being released).


(3) There is at least one nonphysical truth.

Following Stoljar and Nagasawa, let us say that the knowledge intuition is the claim that "no amount of knowledge of a certain sort -- a physical sort -- is going by itself to suffice for knowledge of a different sort -- namely, a phenomenal sort" (2-3). As Stoljar and Nagasawa point out, the knowledge argument factors out the knowledge intuition into two parts. The first part is that no special sorts of experiences (color experiences, for instance) are required for complete physical knowledge. The second part is that this is not all the knowledge to be had, because Mary learns something on her release.

The knowledge intuition is not original with Jackson, and neither is its deployment against physicalism: Stoljar and Nagasawa give examples from Broad, Farrell, Feigl, Meehl, and Robinson. So why award the palm to Jackson? Stoljar and Nagasawa make a convincing case that this is well deserved. Jackson's distinctive and lasting contribution is twofold: (a) the separation of the knowledge intuition, together with the particularly vivid example of Mary, and (b) his subsequent attempts to defend the knowledge argument against the threat posed by the necessary a posteriori.

The simple form of the knowledge argument above neatly illustrates (a), but it does not clearly bring out the relevance of (b). It also has other disadvantages. First, since the real target of the argument is physicalism, the conclusion of the argument should not be (3), but rather that physicalism is false. And this is not at all a picky point, because if we (not unnaturally) understand a "physical truth" to be a truth expressed in the language of some hypothetical complete fundamental physics, then on the face of it (3) is not inconsistent with physicalism. For there would appear to be numerous physicalistically acceptable truths -- for instance, that some mountains have trees growing on them, that the lakes are full of water, that either tigers growl or the astral plane exists -- that are not expressible in an austere physical vocabulary.2 Second, one might boggle at the idea that Mary knows "all the physical facts". These can't be all the actual physical facts, because they presumably rule out the existence of physically omniscient scientists -- hence the supposition that Mary knows them leads to contradiction. Even Jackson's own characterization of Mary's knowledge as "everything physical there is to know about other people" ("What Mary Didn't Know", p. 54) still amounts to stuffing her head to an alarming degree. Third, the simple form of the argument does not happily lend itself to taxonomizing the "So Many Ways of Saying No to Mary", to borrow the title of Van Gulick's essay in this volume.

It will be helpful to consider the knowledge argument in a more expanded form. A fact, let us say, is a true proposition, and a physical fact is a proposition expressed by a true sentence of some hypothetical complete fundamental physics. (What makes this theory a physical theory is a tricky issue that we can set aside.3) Physicalism -- ignoring subtle refinements -- is the doctrine that all the facts supervene with metaphysical necessity on the physical facts. In particular, all the facts about colors and color experiences supervene on the physical facts. ('All the facts about' is very loose, but that will not matter.) We may suppose, further, that the facts about colors and color experiences supervene on a relatively small subset of the physical facts. For the purposes of the argument, Mary's physical knowledge need not go beyond this relatively small subset, thus to some extent ameliorating the second worry in the previous paragraph. Then the knowledge argument -- at least as it is currently understood by Jackson, and (apparently) by most of the contributors to the book -- may be set out as follows:

P1. Mary knows all the physical facts about colors and color experiences while imprisoned.

P2. If physicalism is true, then the physical facts about colors and color experiences a priori imply all the facts about colors and color experiences.

(Jackson's second contribution -- (b), mentioned earlier -- is his lengthy defense of P2.) Hence (from P1, P2):

P3. If physicalism is true, then Mary is in a position to know all the facts about colors and color experiences while imprisoned.

P4. On her release Mary learns something about colors and color experiences -- something she was not in a position to know while imprisoned.

P5. If Mary learns something, she learns facts about colors and color experiences.

Hence (from P4, P5):

P6. Mary learns facts about colors and color experiences that she was not in a position to know while imprisoned.

Hence (from P3, P6):

C. Physicalism is false.4

Hellie, in "Inexpressible Truths and the Allure of the Knowledge Argument", is one contributor who definitely does not understand the knowledge argument in this way. His preferred formulation is essentially the previous one, with 'truth' explicitly interpreted to mean 'true proposition' (p. 336). So the conclusion of the knowledge argument, as Hellie interprets it, is that there is a true proposition that Mary doesn't know while imprisoned, specifically a proposition predicating a certain "reflective/sympathetic concept CR" (p. 345) of experiences. It is not completely clear to me just why Hellie thinks this is a problem for physicalism, but in any event, his paper contains much of interest, including some thoroughly sensible and persuasive remarks about 'what it's like' phrases.

Returning to the argument as set out immediately above, it seems valid. Since there are only four initial premises (P1, P2, P4, and P5), there would appear to be exactly five options, each represented by at least one contribution to the book:

(i). Deny P1.

Stoljar, "Two Conceptions of the Physical".

According to Stoljar, "physical theory only tells us the dispositional properties of physical objects and so does not tell us about the categorical properties, if any, that they have" (p. 313). By 'physical theory' he has in mind something like 'humanly attainable physical theory', which we may suppose circumscribes the extent of imprisoned Mary's physical knowledge. Further, Stoljar suggests that the categorical properties of physical objects are physical properties (pp. 312-4), in which case imprisoned Mary is ignorant of part of the hypothetical complete physics, and P1 is false. If Mary -- perhaps per impossibile -- did know all the physical facts about colors and color experiences then, Stoljar claims, she would be in a position to know all the facts about them. (This position is developed further in Stoljar 2006.) Of all the objections to the knowledge argument, this one concedes the most, allowing that the argument does show something quite spectacular about the Furniture of the Universe. There is much to be said about this objection, but one immediate worry is that the allegedly unknown categorical properties are intuitively no less mental than they are physical, in which case Stoljar's position is best classified as a form of "panprotopsychism" (see Chalmers, p. 287).5

(ii). Deny P2.

Horgan, "Jackson on Physical Information and Qualia"; Tye, "Knowing What It Is Like: The Ability Hypothesis and the Knowledge Argument"; Loar, "Phenomenal States (Revised Version)"; Van Gulick, "So Many Ways of Saying No to Mary".6

This is the most popular option, sometimes labeled (as it is in this volume) the "old facts, new modes/ways" approach. That label is unnecessarily confusing, since this approach does not deny that (speaking plain English) Mary learns a fact when released. It is simpler to set out the knowledge argument with "facts" taken to be the sorts of things (whatever they are) that satisfy the formula 'S knows x' (with 'know' understood in the know-that sense), thus rendering irrelevant any contrived philosophical conceptions of "coarse grained facts" that may be known under one "mode of presentation" but not under another. Labels aside, the basic idea behind denying P2 is that the physical facts might metaphysically determine the experiential facts without implying them a priori. To borrow Loar's example (p. 222) of the same phenomenon: the fact that this bottle contains CH3CH2OH determines but does not a priori imply that it contains alcohol. (Loar, it should be said, thinks that P2 cannot be dismissed quite so easily.)

(iii). Deny P4.

Dennett, "'Epiphenomenal' Qualia?" (an excerpt from Consciousness Explained).

According to Dennett, we think that Mary learns something because we are not imagining Jackson's thought experiment properly: "It is of course true that in any realistic, readily imaginable version of the story, Mary would come to learn something, but in any realistic, readily imaginable version she might know a lot, but she would not know everything physical" (p. 61). Interestingly enough, this response already concedes that the knowledge argument shows something, namely that the correct physical account of color and color experiences is too complicated to be "readily imaginable". No doubt the account is too complicated, but it is perhaps surprising to find Dennett acknowledging that a mere "intuition pump" can tell us that.7

(iv). Deny P5.

Lewis, "What Experience Teaches"; Pettit, "Motion Blindness and the Knowledge Argument"; Jackson, "Mind and Illusion"; Churchland, "Knowing Qualia: A Reply to Jackson (with Postscript: 1997)"; Bigelow and Pargetter, "Acquaintance with Qualia"; Conee, "Phenomenal Knowledge".

Lewis denies P5 by saying that Mary acquires "know-how" (assumed, of course, to exclude "knowledge-that"8). Pettit also denies P5, but a little cagily, saying that "Mary comes … to know in a spontaneous, practical way facts that she previously knew in a different mode" (p. 125). Although the "practical way" is left underexplained, Pettit's paper does ring a welcome change on the official Mary thought experiment: his ingenious example concerns superscientist Eva, confined in "a stroboscopic room", who sees motion for the first time when released. As to Jackson, he agrees "with Laurence Nemirow and David Lewis about what happens to Mary on her release", although he does not explicitly mention "know-how", stressing instead that Mary acquires new abilities. Significantly, his path to this conclusion is neither Lewis's nor Nemirow's: "for the life of me", he says, "I cannot see how we could have known they were right without going via representationalism" (p. 439). More about this later.

Bigelow and Pargetter, and Conee, deny P5 by saying that Mary acquires "knowledge by acquaintance". This has obvious attractions but, as the editors remark, an obvious disadvantage, namely that "the notion of acquaintance is an extraordinarily slippery one" (p. 18). Churchland is sympathetic with the "know-how" response, but renounces the terminology, refusing (of course) to "be bound by the crude divisions of our prescientific idioms" (p. 165). According to him, there is "more than just a clutch of abilities missing in Mary; there is a complex representation, a processing framework that deserves to be called cognitive, which she either lacks entirely or has in severely reduced form. There is indeed something she 'does not know'" (p. 167). Whatever this unknown item is, it is evidently not a proposition. Conee welcomes Churchland as a fellow-traveler (p. 213), and Something About Mary classifies the two (and Bigelow and Pargetter) together.

There is one other way of denying P5: Mary acquires some "self-locating" knowledge, understood not as knowledge of a proposition but as knowledge of a "centered" so-called proposition, or something similar (Perry 2001, Stalnaker forthcoming). There is no obvious advocate for this response in the volume, although arguably it is Bigelow and Pargetter's main idea. This third way of denying P5 is critically discussed by Lewis, pp. 82-4, Nida-Rümelin, pp. 261-2, and Chalmers, pp. 277-8, and pp. 285-6.

(v). Accept C.

Jackson, "Epiphenomal Qualia", and "What Mary Didn't Know"; Robinson, "Dennett on the Knowledge Argument"; Chalmers, "Phenomenal Concepts and the Knowledge Argument"; Nida-Rümelin "What Mary Couldn't Know".

Although Chalmers and Nida-Rümelin accept C (reading between the lines, in Nida-Rümelin's case), we shall shortly see that Chalmers (explicitly) and Nida-Rümelin (implicitly) do not endorse the above argument.

These five options are all controversial. Much has been written about each, and no end is in sight. However, as Stoljar and Nagasawa point out (in effect, and a little coyly) in their introduction, the knowledge argument as set out above is an enthymeme -- and once the missing premise is restored, the argument just begs the question. Comparing Mary to Nagel's bat, they observe that:

the bat example relies on the fact that we are so different from bats that it is unlikely that we could so much as conceive of or imagine their experiences. But this invites the response that the reason that physical knowledge doesn't yield phenomenal knowledge in this case is that [it] is impossible for us to attain the concepts to formulate the relevant phenomenal knowledge in the first place. On the other hand, if this is the explanation for the knowledge intuition, it is difficult to see that it places physicalism under threat. After all, physicalism does not entail that we humans must be able to imagine or conceive the experiences of bats. (p. 11)

A few pages later, they remark that, according to Tye and Loar, "Mary gains a new 'phenomenal' concept when she comes out of her room". And:

If Mary gains a new concept, then there is a straightforward response to the argument: the reason why she does not know the relevant phenomenal truths is because she does not so much as understand them. In effect, this position makes the charge against Jackson's version of the knowledge argument that we noted when discussing Nagel's bat; the objection that the knowledge intuition can be explained psychologically, and if so, there is no threat to physicalism. (p. 19)

With studied editorial neutrality, Stoljar and Nagasawa present this as just one among the many ways of saying no to Mary.

Since the objection is quite devastating, it is worth dwelling on for a moment. Let 'Φ' express the relevant physical facts, and let 'Ψ' express a fact that, according to a proponent of the knowledge argument, Mary comes to learn (that experiences of seeing red have this property, perhaps). According to P1, imprisoned Mary knows that Φ, and according to P2, if physicalism is true, then it is a priori that if Φ then Ψ. P3 -- if physicalism is true, Mary is in a position to know that Ψ -- is supposed to follow because Mary can reason a priori to the conclusion that Ψ from two items of knowledge she has while imprisoned: that Φ, and that if Φ then Ψ. But this step to P3 tacitly assumes that, if physicalism is true, imprisoned Mary is in a position to entertain the proposition that if Φ then Ψ -- if she can't so much as think it, then P3 does not follow. (See Stoljar 2005, 474-5; apart from the introduction, this objection to the knowledge argument is noted in Chalmers' paper, at p. 284, Hellie's, at p. 348, and Van Gulick's, at p. 382.9)

Here is an analogy. Suppose Fred the monkey can do simple arithmetic. Fred knows that there are seventeen peanuts on the floor. Despite the fact that Fred is the greatest ever monkey logician, he is not in a position to know that the number of peanuts on the floor = the number of plane symmetry groups. Does that show that it is not a priori that if there are seventeen peanuts on the floor then the number of peanuts = the number of plane symmetry groups? No -- it is a priori. (It is a theorem that there are seventeen plane symmetry groups.) The reason why Fred is not in a position to know that the number of peanuts on the floor = the number of plane symmetry groups is that he does not have the conceptual sophistication to think about group theory.

So, the knowledge argument needs another premise (call it 'P2.5'), to bridge the step from P1 and P2 to P3. Suppose that 'p' expresses a fact about colors and color experiences. By P2, the fact that p is a priori implied by the physical facts, and by P1, Mary knows the physical facts. We can see from the example of Fred that P2 will only allow Mary to come to know that p by deduction if she is able to entertain the proposition that p. P2.5, then, is this: if physicalism is true, imprisoned Mary can entertain every proposition about colors and color experiences. If P2.5 is false, then the knowledge argument is unsound.

So, is P2.5 false? Physicalism itself is silent on the issue of whether someone in Mary's monochromatic predicament could entertain every proposition about colors and color experiences -- physicalist, depending on her other commitments, may take either side. What's more, there is no straightforward route to P2.5 from P2: the usual arguments for P2 (see, for instance, Chalmers, pp. 280-1, pp. 287-93; Jackson, pp. 411-5, 424-6) do not show that P2.5 is true.10

Of course, this doesn't show that P2.5 is false. But now notice that the claim that Mary gains knowledge that Ψ when released stands or falls together with the claim that she can't entertain the proposition that Ψ when imprisoned. We are supposed to imagine Mary exclaiming "I never knew … !" when she sees the red rose, but it is no less compelling to imagine Mary exclaiming "I never even thought … !" As Hellie puts it:

Conjure in yourself an experience of seeing a red thing, focus on its character, and think to yourself 'I wonder whether this is what it's like to see a red thing'. Mary couldn't have done that, before her release. (p. 348)

This still doesn't show the falsity of P2.5, but it does show the impotence of the knowledge argument. Imagine a physicalist who has not yet taken a stand on the issue of imprisoned Mary's conceptual limitations. He sees the knowledge argument for the first time, and is convinced by the truth of P1, P2, P4, and P5. In particular, he is convinced that Mary learns that Ψ when released. Assuming he has conventional intuitions on the matter, he is committed to denying the consequent of P2.5, and so to denying that Mary can entertain the proposition that Ψ while imprisoned. Since this denial does not threaten physicalism in any way, he should remain a physicalist, reject P2.5, and thereby take the knowledge argument to be unsound. Of course, if physicalism is false then he should accept P2.5, but the falsity of physicalism is what the knowledge argument is supposed to establish in the first place. Disputes about our imaginative limitations, the ability hypothesis, acquaintance, and the rest, fascinating though they are, just serve to distract attention from this fundamental flaw.

Can the argument be repaired? There are two main options. First, one might supplement the argument with the Lewis/Stalnaker view that propositions are sets of possible worlds (or functions from worlds to truth values). Since the possible worlds conception of a proposition leads naturally to the position that knowledge is closed under necessary consequence (at least in an ideal agent like Mary), this supplement amounts to a simultaneous defense of P2, P2.5, and P3. In fact, with this assumption on board, the argument is more perspicuously rewritten without P2 and P2.5, and with a stronger version of P3, obtained by replacing 'is in a position to know' with 'knows'.11 Lewis himself seems to have endorsed this initial segment of the knowledge argument on something like these grounds (1994, 296-7), and the move is also suggested in Jackson 1998 (for discussion see Byrne 1999 and Soames 2005). Chalmers does not accept the possible worlds conception of a proposition (see Chalmers 2004a) and accordingly holds P2 for other reasons.

The chief difficulty with this repair is dialectical: the crucial assumption about propositions is a minority view, and is plainly not shared by most of the contributors to Something About Mary. "The task", Jackson writes in "Epiphenomenal Qualia", “is to present an argument whose premises are obvious to all, or at least to as many as possible" (p. 40).

To introduce the second option, recall the problem with the original thought experiment. Mary's release apparently combines two sorts of novelties: (i) entertaining the proposition that Ψ ; (ii) knowing that Ψ . (This important point was first noticed in Nida-Rümelin's "What Mary Couldn't Know" -- see p. 254.) The problem was that given (i), (ii) is not in conflict with physicalism. So one might naturally propose tweaking the thought experiment, removing (i) while preserving (ii). That is the second option.

And it is Chalmers' strategy, in response to what he describes as "one of the more powerful replies available to a materialist" (p. 284): "One can … argue that once Mary has the relevant phenomenal concept, she will not automatically know whether or not other organisms (bats or Martians, say) are having experiences of the relevant sort, even given a complete physical description of them" (p. 285). It is also the reply in Stoljar 2005, pp. 486-8: "Experienced Mary" has been given an experience of red when imprisoned, so she can entertain the hypothesis that other people have this kind of experience when they look at tomatoes, but still she is no in position to know it. (See also Nida-Rümelin's example of Marianna, p. 243.)

The first option is dialectically ineffective. The second option has another defect: it collapses the knowledge argument into the conceivability argument. The conceivability argument (more exactly, one version of it) is this: it is conceivable that Φ and not-Ψ , therefore it is possible that Φ and not-Ψ (i.e. possible that not-(if Φ then Ψ )) and so physicalism is false. Sometimes 'It is conceivable that p' is defined as 'It is not knowable a priori that not-p'. With that stipulation, the conceivability argument can be rewritten as follows: it is not a priori that if Φ then Ψ , therefore it is possible that not-(if Φ then Ψ ), and so physicalism is false. The "Experienced Mary" argument replaces the first premise of the conceivability argument with 'Experienced Mary learns that Ψ when released', but this replacement is equivalent to the first premise. If Experienced Mary learns that Ψ , then it is not a priori if Φ then Ψ -- if it were, then she could have known that Ψ by deduction while imprisoned. Conversely, if it is not a priori that if Φ then Ψ , then Experienced Mary is in no position to know that Ψ while imprisoned. The Chalmers/Stoljar thought experiment at best provides a vivid way of seeing that the first premise of the conceivability argument is true, but that is all. And since "Epiphenomenal Qualia" took great pains to distinguish the knowledge argument from the "modal argument" (a.k.a. the conceivability argument), this means that the second option amounts to giving up the knowledge argument entirely.12,13

Finally, why does Jackson now reject the knowledge argument? He originally changed his mind because, he thought, it was a mistake to say (in "Epiphenomenal Qualia") that we can have knowledge of qualia even if they have no causal effects on our opinions -- so "what [Mary] learns had better not outrun how things are physically" ("Postscript on Qualia", p. 418). However, that leaves the mistake in the knowledge argument undiagnosed. In "Postscript on Qualia" Jackson suggests that the intuition that Mary learns something can be explained away because "sensory experience is putative information about certain highly relational and functional facts … its very nature is representational" (p. 419). This line of thought is elaborated at greater length in the later paper, "Mind and Illusion". The key assumption is representationalism -- that "the phenomenal nature of an experience [cannot] outrun its representational nature" (p. 429); in particular, "the redness of sensings of red is the putative redness of what is seen" (p. 427). Given representationalism, Jackson argues that it is a confusion to suppose that Mary learns something on her release:

There is a redness about sensing red … We naturally think of the redness as the property we are acquainted with when we sense red and as the property Mary finds out about on her release. We may want to distinguish redness as a property of objects from redness as a property of an area of our visual field, perhaps using 'red*' for the latter. Either way, what it is like is, on the picture, a matter of having redness or redness*, knowing what it is like is knowing about redness or redness*, and the knowledge argument is an argument to the conclusion that Mary does not know about redness or redness* -- that is, about the property we are, according to the picture, acquainted with when we sense red.

Intensionalism [representationalism] tells us that there is no such property. To suppose otherwise is to confuse an intensional property with an instantiated one. (p. 430)

Jackson's point is, I think, this. According to a proponent of the knowledge argument, Mary discovers that experiences of red have a certain "striking feature" Q. What is that striking feature? Well, according to "the representationalist-cum-intensionalist approach" (p. 431), the only striking ("qualitative") feature available to introspection when one has an experience of red is redness -- a property that external objects like tomatoes are represented as having. (Redness* is not a candidate, because there is only such a property if the sense datum theory is true.) Thus, to suppose that Mary learns that experiences have Q is to confuse "an intensional property [a property that experiences represent] with an instantiated one [a property that experiences have]". It is, in the terminology of Thau 2002, p. 35, to succumb to "generalized use-mention confusion".

Fair enough -- experiences of red aren't red. But tomatoes are not just represented as red -- they are red. So why not say that Mary learns that tomatoes have the striking feature Q? Physicalism is not false because experiences have non-physical qualia, but false nonetheless, because tomatoes have non-physical colors. Jackson brushes this reply aside:

Intensionalism means that no amount of tub-thumping assertion by dualists (including by myself in the past) that the redness of seeing red cannot be accommodated in the austere physicalist picture carries any weight. That striking feature is a feature of how things are represented to be, and if, as claimed by the tub thumpers, it is transparently a feature that has no place in the physicalist picture, what follows is that physicalists should deny that anything has that striking feature. And this is no argument against physicalism. (p. 431)

Thus, if the tub thumpers insist that Mary discovers that tomatoes have the striking feature Q (i.e., are red), the physicalist can just deny that they have this feature: Mary's experience represents that they are red, but it doesn't follow that they are red. True, it doesn't follow, but still: tomatoes are red, right? Why isn't the physicalist the one who's thumping the tub?

Here Jackson would doubtless appeal to causal considerations (see p. 418). If tomatoes have some non-physical feature Q, Q is epiphenomenal, and so we cannot learn that tomatoes have Q via perception. Let us not pause to examine this reply further14, because Jackson seems to have overlooked a property that, by his own lights, is instantiated, namely the property of representing redness. Without even touching the tub, let alone thumping it, a representationalist may argue as follows. When Mary is released, she learns that some experiences, in particular her own, have the property of representing a certain striking feature. That feature is redness, which is not instantiated. Admittedly, Mary does not learn that anything is red, because nothing is. But her experience does represent redness, and that is what Mary learns. Isn't this perfectly tempting? To succumb may well be a mistake but, pace Jackson, the temptation does not arise "from the conflation of intensional properties with instantiated ones" (p. 433).15 And if that is right, then representationalism cannot explain away the intuition that Mary acquires knowledge when released.

Although it doesn't save his diagnosis of the intuition, Jackson does think that a representationalist should deny that Mary learns anything -- in particular, that her experience represents redness. This bolsters his early suspicion that the knowledge argument must go wrong, but without explaining away its appeal. Mary doesn't learn anything, Jackson argues, because the representational facts are plausibly a priori implied by the physical facts, and (given representationalism) if Mary learns anything, this can only be a representational fact:

Seeing red is being in a certain kind of representational state on this account. The project of finding an analysis of representation is not an easy one -- to put it mildly. But it is a standard item on the philosophical agenda and the answers that have been, or are likely to be, canvassed are all answers that would allow the fact of representation to follow a priori from the physical account of what our world is like. (p. 432)

However, this argument is hardly conclusive (not that Jackson pretends that it is). Even if it is conceded that existing accounts of representation do allow for a priori deducibility (itself a highly contentious claim), it is unclear why the adjustment should be made to our judgment that Mary learns something, as opposed to the highly programmatic attempts to "naturalize intentionality". Why not revise the speculative philosophical theory, instead of trashing the plain man's verdict that Mary's post-release condition "is rightly described as learning -- she will not say 'ho, hum'"? Indeed, that is precisely Chalmers' position (2004b).16

Given Jackson's diagnosis of the mistaken intuition that Mary learns a fact, one might suppose that his account ends with (philosophically muddled) Mary acquiring a false belief about redness when released: "if she makes the mistake of conflating intensional properties with instantiated ones, she will think that she has learned something new about how things are, but she'll be wrong" (p. 439). Or, putting it slightly differently: because we fall into "generalized use-mention confusion", we think that Mary will acquire a belief -- moreover, a true belief. But we are wrong. Mary, being au courant with the latest in philosophical fashion, would never commit a non-sequitur of such numbing grossness. When she is released, she will not even arch a perfectly plucked eyebrow; Dennett is right, and P4 is false.

However, as revealed earlier, the surprising twist in the tale is that the culprit is P5: specifically, the Lewis/Nemirow ability hypothesis is right. No doubt Jackson has his reasons, but on the face of it the jaw-dropping denouement of "Mind and Illusion" is not needed.

* * * * *

Something About Mary deconstructs itself in a most pleasing way. Since Mary has outlived her usefulness as a poster child for the qualia freaks, she should be killed off. Jackson is not the best choice of hitman, since authors notoriously have difficulty in permanently dispatching their own creations. Fortunately we can turn again to David Lodge's Thinks…, and to this retelling of Jackson's story in the style of Henry James:

Dearing observed the direction of her gaze and glanced down complacently at the flower, fingering the lapel of his jacket. 'This is --' he began. But before he could say more she had collapsed at his feet.

'Mary!' he exclaimed in horror. He knelt swiftly beside her, felt her pulse, ripped apart the bodice of her dress, loosened the tight lacing of her corset, and pressed his ear to her breast. But to no avail. The redness of the rosebud had penetrated her brain like an arrow, and her fragile heart, overcharged by the intensity of the sensation, had stopped.17


Alter, T., Forthcoming, "Does Representationalism Undermine the Knowledge Argument?", in Phenomenal Concepts and Phenomenal Knowledge: New Essays on Consciousness and Physicalism, T. Alter and S. Walter (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.

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1 The character explaining the knowledge argument is Ralph Messenger, "Director of the prestigious Holt Belling Centre for Cognitive Science" at the "University of Gloucester". Despite doing his Cambridge PhD "on the Philosophy of Mind", Messenger's explanation is of course seriously confused. Possibly he is distracted by his fragrant addressee, Helen Reed, with whom he will shortly be having an affair. (Thinks … is mentioned in the introduction to There's Something About Mary, n. 1, pp. 24-5.)

2 Although they do not explicitly say so, Stoljar and Nagasawa are evidently assuming a slightly different conception of a physical truth, namely one that is an a priori consequence of truths expressible in the language of complete fundamental physics. On this construal there is still a gap between (3) and the falsity of physicalism -- this is why Stoljar and Nagasawa go on to raise the question of whether "physicalism is consistent with the existence of nonphysical truths" (p. 14), given "the shadow cast by the necessary a posteriori" (p. 15).

3 This issue is not as pressing as it might seem, since, as Lewis insightfully observes, "Our intuitive starting point wasn't just that physics lessons couldn't help the inexperienced to know what it's like. It was that lessons couldn't help" (p. 93). See also Churchland, pp. 167-8; Hellie, p. 350; and Jackson, "What Mary Didn't Know", p. 55.

4 Of course, since Mary is a fictional character, this can't quite be the real knowledge argument. Mary is just a convenient device for talking about possible situations in which someone is in Mary's predicament. For more discussion, see Stoljar 2006, ch. 2.

5 Harman (1990) is sometimes classified as denying P1. He does deny that a person "blind from birth" knows "all the physical and functional facts about color perception" because, first, she "does not have the full concept of something's being red" (p. 45) and, second, there is "one important functional fact" that a person can only entertain (hence know) if she has the concept of being red. Harman refers to Jackson, and clearly has the knowledge argument in mind. However, as Thau (2002, p. 210) points out, by Harman's own lights there is nothing to prevent Mary, who isn't blind, from having the concept of being red while imprisoned. And in any case, Harman does not suggest that a person blind from birth could not know all the physical facts, as narrowly construed earlier. So, whether or not Harman intends to deny P1, his paper does not contain an argument for this.

Harman's paper, and ch. 5 of Thau 2002, are especially notable -- if understandable -- omissions from Something About Mary.

6 Horgan and Van Gulick's papers both appear in the section called "Did She Know Everything Physical?". But it is clear that their response to the argument as set out above would be to deny P2.

7 Dennett's and Stoljar's responses are similar. Both hold that (readily imaginable) Mary is ignorant of some physical facts. But Dennett, unlike Stoljar, thinks that the missing facts are supplied by humanly attainable -- and perhaps even attained -- science.

8 For a convincing argument that the former is a species of the latter, see Stanley and Williamson 2001, discussed approvingly by Hellie at pp. 356-7. For more references, see the introduction, n. 25, p. 27.

9 As Chalmers notes (p. 284), "suggestions in the vicinity" may be found in Harman 1990 and Tye 2000 (Tye, in particular, seems to be right on target at p. 29). For more suggestions in (or within walking distance of) the vicinity see Nida-Rümelin's paper, Loar's paper, Block 2002, Levine 2001, Lycan 1996, Papineau 2002, and Sturgeon 1994, among others. Probably the credit should be distributed over a number of people, but Stoljar is certainly one of the first to see the point clearly -- I myself learnt of it from Stoljar years ago.

10 See also Chalmers and Jackson 2001, a reply to the dissent of Block and Stalnaker 1999.

11 For relevant discussion, see Stalnaker 1987, ch. 5.

12 I doubt that Stoljar and Chalmers would protest too much. Stoljar notes (fn. 14, p. 475) that the revised version of the knowledge argument "brings it much closer to the conceivability argument", although his official position seems to be that the revised knowledge argument remains distinct from the conceivability argument. And Chalmers basically sets out the knowledge argument as a form of the conceivability argument from the start (p. 280; see also Chalmers 2006).

13 Incidentally, in his discussion of the modal argument, Jackson seems to float the possibility that "aesthetic qualities" are necessitated by "natural qualities" without being a priori entailed by them (p. 44). That recommends a mild scepticism about the exegesis of the introduction, that the argument of "Epiphenomenal Qualia" is a compressed version of the knowledge argument as set out here.

14 For some doubts, see Byrne and Hilbert forthcoming, section 4.1.

15 Similar remarks go for the view that Mary learns that tomatoes have some non-physical feature. Incidentally, there is another candidate for what Mary learns, according to the representationalist, namely higher-order truths about the non-instantiated property redness: see Johnston 2004, p. 146; cf. Conee, p. 202.

16 For more discussion of Jackson's arguments in "Mind and Illusion", see Alter forthcoming and Van Gulick 2006.

17 For very helpful comments and conversations, I am indebted to Ned Block, Richard Holton, Bob Stalnaker, and Daniel Stoljar.