Thick Concepts

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Simon Kirchin (ed.), Thick Concepts, Oxford University Press, 2013, 237pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199672349.

Reviewed by Jonas Olson, Stockholm University


Thick concepts in ethics are typically thought to be those that involve both descriptive and evaluative components. A few standard examples are fairness, kindness, generosity, courage, brutality, selfishness, and cowardice. In its early days, the debate about thick concepts was largely a debate for and against non-cognitivism, with cognitivists like Philippa Foot, Bernard Williams, and John McDowell on the one side, and non-cognitivists like R. M. Hare and Simon Blackburn on the other. In recent years, however, the debate as a whole has shifted to focus more directly on the nature of thick concepts rather than their putative relevance for the truth or falsity of non-cognitivism. This is reflected in the present volume, in which questions about the truth or falsity of non-cognitivism are present only in the background, while questions concerning what thick concepts are appear in the foreground.

At the heart of the debate in its early days was the question whether the descriptive and evaluative components of thick concepts can be disentangled. As Simon Kirchin explains, this is the issue of whether thick concepts can be 'separated into distinct, isolatable, and independently intelligible parts: typically some evaluative conceptual content and some descriptive conceptual content. . . . whether [thick concepts] can be broken down into more basic elements' (6-7). Cognitivists following McDowell argued that they cannot and that this spells serious trouble for non-cognitivism. The idea went something like this: Non-cognitivists are committed to the view that the descriptive components of thick concepts like, say, just or selfish, identify a determinate set of non-evaluative properties, while the evaluative components express attitudes of approval or disapproval. This is to say that the descriptive components of thick concepts fully determine their extensions. But this fails to take into account the fact that determining whether a person is, say, just or selfish, requires making evaluations; it is in this sense that evaluation drives the extension of thick concepts. Connected to this idea was the idea that thick judgements about, e.g., justice or selfishness, are uncodifiable, or non-evaluatively 'shapeless'.

It should be noted, however, that disentangling is not just an issue for non-cognitivists. As Kirchin points out in his editorial introduction, and as Daniel Elstein and Tom Hurka pointed out in a joint article a few years ago, cognitivists who defend analyses of thick concepts in terms of thin evaluative concepts plus descriptive concepts are also committed to distentangling.[1] Elstein and Hurka made two more points that are worthy of notice here. The first is that there is no obvious conflict between disentangling and uncodifiability of thick concepts. For suppose that thin concepts like goodness and wrongness are uncodifiable. The uncodifiability of thick concepts then follows readily from analyses of thick concepts in terms of thin concepts plus descriptive concepts.

The second point is that disentanglers need not hold that the descriptive components of thick concepts identify a determinate set of non-evaluative properties; they can hold, more plausibly, that the descriptive components identify kinds of non-evaluative properties, but that there is some indeterminacy in what these non-evaluative properties are exactly. To illustrate, the non-evaluative properties relevant to determining whether a person is selfish may be of a kind that has to do with giving more or equal weight to one's own happiness as compared to the happiness of others. But the set of non-evaluative properties identified by the descriptive component of the concept of selfishness need be no more determinate than that. Strict impartialists may hold that it is bad, and thus selfish, to give more weight to a certain amount of happiness for oneself than to the same amount of happiness for another person. Partialists may hold that some degree of personal bias is not bad, and thus not selfish, but they may disagree on when and to what degree it is bad to give more weight to one's own happiness than to the happiness of others. The point is that these controversies are genuinely evaluative controversies that are not determined simply by the very concept of selfishness. Impartialists and partialists can thus have substantive disagreements about what it takes for a person to be selfish. In this way, disentanglers can agree that evaluation drives the extension of thick concepts, like selfishness.

The possibility of disentangling (or 'separationism', as it is also called in this volume) remains a live issue in the contemporary debate about the nature of thick concepts, and as the editor says in his introduction, the first four chapters, by Jonathan Dancy, Simon Kirchin, Debbie Roberts, and Edward Harcourt and Alan Thomas, 'form a group of papers that are explicitly in favour of a nonseparationist outlook' (15). Somewhat disappointingly, however, three of the four papers do not argue primarily in favour of nonseparationism, which is not to suggest that they do not address other issues of crucial interest. Dancy's contribution discusses variability in valence of thick concepts and the question of what is distinctive of thick concepts. His answer to the latter question is that they have 'an intrinsic practical relevance' (57).

Kirchin's contribution seeks to improve our understanding of thick and thin concepts by utilizing Gilbert Ryle's idea of thick descriptions. Using one of Ryle's examples, we can imagine a number of boys who wink in different ways (67): the first boy has an involuntary twitch; the second winks to conspire with a friend; and the third winks to parody maliciously the first boy's twitch. The thinnest descriptions of the three cases only mention the boys' physical behaviour, which is common to all three. To distinguish the cases we need to employ thick descriptions that involve mental notions, like the boys' intentions. There might well be interesting parallels between thick concepts and Ryle's thick descriptions, but they seem to me congenial to separationism. For it seems that in the cases of the three boys we can easily disentangle their physical movements and their intentions (or lack thereof), much as disentanglers maintain that we can disentangle the evaluative and the descriptive components of thick concepts.

Traditionally it has been common ground between disentaglers and entanglers that thick concepts involve descriptive and thinly evaluative conceptual content, and the disagreement has concerned whether the two can be disentangled in analysis. Call the view that constitutes the common ground between disentanglers and entanglers the Content view. The alternative is the Pragmatic view, according to which (so-called) thick concepts do not involve thinly evaluative concepts. (I come back to this distinction presently.)

Roberts argues that this map needs to be enriched and redrawn in order to leave space for what she calls the Inclusive view, according to which thick concepts are evaluative but not in virtue of involving thin evaluations. The idea is that thick concepts are too homogenous to involve descriptive and thinly evaluative components that may or may not be disentangled in analysis. This raises thorny questions about what evaluation is, and on this Roberts has interesting things to say. In the end, though, I wasn't sure where on the taxonomical map the Inclusive view fits in. Roberts says at one point that the Inclusive view is a 'third alternative' to Content views and Pragmatic views (79), but she then goes on to describe the view as a 'Content view of the thick' (81). Perhaps the way to understand this is that according to the Inclusive view, thick concepts involve evaluations, but not thin evaluations, as parts of their content. On this understanding the Inclusive view is a version of the Content view, which differs from traditional versions, but it is not a third alternative to the Content view and the Pragmatic view.

The paper out of the first four that comes closest to an explicit defence of entangling is the one by Harcourt and Thomas. They begin by sketching a view of thick concepts according to which they are determinates of determinable thin evaluative concepts. 'Selfish', for example, is a determinate of 'bad', analogously to how 'red' is a determinate of 'coloured´ (25). This view seems to go naturally together with entangling, since it views the difference between the thinly and the thickly evaluative in terms of differing degrees of determinateness. The main part of the paper, however, is not devoted to an elaboration of this view but to criticisms of alternative views, including the aforementioned position of Elstein and Hurka and one of Pekka Väyrynen's recent arguments in favour of a pragmatic view. It would have been nice to know more about Harcourt and Thomas's own view, which, though it has some intuitive appeal leaves some questions. For example, which determinables are various thick concepts determinates of? Is 'selfish' a determinate of 'bad', or of 'wrong', or of both? Second, there seems to be a disanalogy between how specific colour terms, like 'red', determine 'coloured' and how thick terms supposedly determine thinly evaluative terms. Consider the supposedly thick concept of generosity and the related concept of charity. An act or a person can be too benevolent for it or her to be good or right; a supervisor, for example, might be too generous with her time, and her interpretations may be too charitable to be correct or plausible. By contrast, an object can hardly be 'too red' to be coloured.

The papers by Michael Smith and Simon Blackburn are, as Kirchin says, 'separationist in spirit' (16). Blackburn repeats his argument from Ruling Passions (1998) against entangling á la McDowell. We are to imagine a group of speakers who use 'cute' as a thick term to appraise certain kinds of subservient behaviour in women. Using such a concept is objectionable, but Blackburn's point is that if we cannot disentangle the evaluation from what is evaluated, we cannot properly criticise this use. The users could simply respond that critics have failed to grasp the relevant concept of cuteness. In the light of Blackburn's paper, it would, again, have been useful to have an explicit defence of entangling along with a careful discussion of what precisely the difference between entangling and disentangling is, especially since Blackburn agrees that 'the load drives the extension' of thick concepts (129).

Michael Smith's topic is the nature of thick concepts. He argues, contra Dancy, that the distinction between thin and thick is not one of type but of degree. According to Smith, there isn't really a distinction, because 'all ethical concepts are a little bit thick' (119). To make a long story short, this is because the basic normative concept is that of a reason, and there are constraints on what kinds of non-normative properties can provide reasons for attitudes and actions. In denying that there is a real distinction to be made between thin and thick, Smith's conclusion resembles Timothy Chappell's. Chappell begins and ends his contribution with the claim that there are no thin concepts, but he throws in the caveat that there might after all be two, generic demandedness and generic commendedness (191). Smith's conclusion, however, may sound more radical than it really is. It seems not far-fetched to assume that what philosophers have had in mind when they have contrasted thin and thick concepts is roughly what Smith has in mind in distinguishing between 'the maximally-thin thick ethical concepts and the not-maximally-thin thick ethical concepts' (119).

As indicated above, the Content view, according to which (thin) evaluation is part of the content of thick concepts, has traditionally been common ground between entanglers and disentanglers. If the Content view is false, claims about (dis)entangling do not apply. Väyrynen's pragmatic view of the thick challenges the Content view.[2] In his contribution he seeks to undermine a prominent argument in favour of the Content view, namely the idea that the descriptive content underdetermines the extension of thick concepts (a.k.a. the idea that evaluation drives the extension). Matti Eklund's chapter continues along similar tracks and also ties in nicely with Roberts's contribution in that it considers what it is for a property or a fact, or a concept or a linguistic expression, to be evaluative. The contributions by Väyrynen and Eklund are highly interesting and call for some fundamental rethinking about the nature of thick concepts.

Nick Zangwill argues that we should rethink the standard examples of thick concepts, such as courage and kindness. Zangwill defends a pragmatic view about the evaluativeness of these concepts and holds that 'it is no trivial semantic claim that courage and kindness are good' (199). We should look elsewhere for examples of thick concepts; especially we should look at what Zangwill calls 'moral metaphors', which are supposed analogues of aesthetic metaphors, i.e., terms and phrases we use to express what is otherwise inexpressible. Zangwill recommends that we leave behind examples like 'courageous' and 'kind' and focus on 'a***hole' and 'c**t'. But to me it seems a far-fetched idea that these terms are metaphors used (or usable) in moral debates. The perlocutionary force of the terms is to insult or offend and this normally has no distinctive place in moral debates. Moreover, if 'c**t' expresses a thick concept that involves a negative evaluative component, the expression 'good c**t' would be self-contradictory. It seems not to be, however; it is in use among certain football fans as an endearing expression, commonly applied to fellow supporters of the same team. This suggests that Zangwill's grounds for denying that 'courageous' and 'kind' express thick concepts apply equally to 'a***hole' and 'c**t'.

The volume ends with two chapters that differ in focus from the foregoing. Eric Wiland critically examines Williams's theory of thick concepts and its fit with his theory of internal reasons. Valerie Tiberius draws parallels between the debate about thick concepts and the debate about the concept of well-being. She warns against too simplistic a model of the division of labour between philosophers and psychologists, roughly that philosophers work out the concepts and theories, and psychologists apply them to reality.

Readers should be aware that several chapters in this volume require familiarity with the debate about thick concepts. For those who have some familiarity already, the volume has a lot to offer. As indicated above, the debate is currently undergoing a shift of focus, and several chapters suggest new and interesting directions.[3]


Blackburn, S. 1998. Ruling Passions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Elstein, D. and T. Hurka 2009. 'From Thick to Thin: Two Moral Reduction Plans', Canadian Journal of Philosophy 39: 515-36.

Väyrynen, P. 2013. The Lewd, the Rude, and the Nasty: A Study of Thick Concepts in Ethics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] Elstein and Hurka (2009).

[2] For a recent full defence of the Pragmatic view, see Väyrynen 2013.

[3] Many thanks to Krister Bykvist and Frans Svensson for helpful discussions about matters pertaining to this review.