Thick Evaluation

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Simon Kirchin, Thick Evaluation, Oxford University Press, 2017, 198pp., $61.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803430.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Uppsala University


Simon Kirchin's book is an extended discussion of so-called thick evaluative concepts (thick concepts, for short) -- concepts like, to use Kirchin's examples, WICKED, SELFISH, KIND, BRAVE, and DECEITFUL. Thick concepts contrast with thin concepts -- where examples mentioned are GOOD, RIGHT, and OUGHT. (Throughout I will use caps when talking about concepts.) More specifically, the book picks up and develops themes from the on-going discussions of thick concepts, which has been lively since at least the 1980s, with important early contributors being Bernard Williams, John McDowell, David Wiggins, Simon Blackburn, Allan Gibbard and Jonathan Dancy (with precursors being Philippa Foot and Iris Murdoch). Much of the discussion has concerned whether thick concepts can be separated into evaluative and descriptive components. In Kirchin's terminology, "separationists" say yes, and "nonseparationists" say no. This debate is supposed to have implications, for example, for the debate over noncognitivism: noncognitivists are supposed to be committed to separationism by virtue of how they see the evaluative as fundamentally different from the descriptive. Kirchin discusses some of the most influential arguments and views in this debate, and presents his own arguments for a nonseparationist view.

Let me begin with a quick summary. After the introductory chapter one, chapter two discusses varieties of separationism. Chapter three is a critical discussion of two popular models for discussing the thin/thick distinction, the genus-species model and the determinable-determinate model. Chapter four discusses how to understand the notion of a thin concept. Chapter five evaluates the main argument in the relevant literature, the disentangling argument, due to McDowell and Wiggins. This argument says that descriptive and evaluative elements in thick concepts cannot be disentangled in the way that the separationist envisages. This is supposedly because thick concepts are "shapeless" in relation to the descriptive: their extensions cannot be determined from only descriptive conceptual content. Kirchin's verdict is that this argument is inconclusive. Chapter six presents Kirchin's own main argument for nonseparationism. This argument appeals to a "liberal view on evaluation". I will return to this. Chapter seven is a critical discussion of Pekka Väyrynen's (2009) recent arguments to the effect that the supposed thick evaluative concepts are not evaluative at all: instead thick terms convey evaluation via pragmatic mechanisms. Chapter eight picks up some loose ends and discusses some aspects of the thought of Williams. In the concluding chapter nine, Kirchin returns more explicitly to questions about normative realism than in earlier chapters.

Kirchin's discussion is strikingly independent of ongoing debates in the literature other than those specifically about separationism/nonseparationism. The main arguments he discusses date back to the 1980s. There have been significant developments since then, both in philosophy of language and in metaethics. Noncognitivism/expressivism has become sophisticated, and new versions of the view have emerged, for example in the literature on hybrid expressivism (for an overview see Mark Schroeder 2009). Relatedly, the problem of "creeping minimalism" -- how can cognitivism and sophisticated expressivism be distinguished? -- has become a going concern (Jamie Dreier 2004). Expressivist proposals about epistemic discourse have been put forward (see Hartry Field, e.g. 2009). It is not obvious that Kirchin's considerations do not apply equally given these developments, but it is striking that they are not discussed, let alone mentioned. Contemporary expressivists like Simon Blackburn and Allan Gibbard are certainly discussed, but then only their specific contributions to the debate over thick concepts and not what their general outlooks are, or how these outlooks have developed. The tools of philosophy of language have been sharpened since the 1980s in potentially relevant ways, for example through the discussions of semantics versus pragmatics, and through the discussion of slurs. Again, none of this has made a mark on Kirchin's book. One interesting aspect of Pekka Väyrynen's book is how it seeks to bring the tools of contemporary philosophy of language to the debate over thick concepts. Kirchin has serious arguments against Väyrynen, but represents a step backwards by discussing meaning and content at a more intuitive level.

Early on, Kirchin says that he "brackets" the dispute over what concepts are, and that in doing so he does what others who have studied thick concepts have done (15). He may be right about his predecessors, but it is still not clear to me that this is a wise course to take. The whole set-up of the debate between "separationists" and "nonseparationists" presupposes what maybe ought to be controversial: that one can legitimately speak of concepts as having parts or aspects that can be separated.

Even if the nonseparationists like Kirchin deny a particular separability claim, they accept these terms of the debate. But on some views all there is to the content of a concept is the concept's reference, the property it picks out. But then the nonseparationist wins for a very general reason: it does not make sense to speak of parts of a concept. (One can speak of the referent's parts, but that is not what is intended.)

Traditional noncognitivism is special in that the noncognitivist holds that the "part" of a thick concept that is not descriptive is not a matter of content in the traditional sense at all. So even if the content per se does not have parts, there are parts of a thick concept. But the arguments Kirchin discusses and defends are supposed to target also cognitivist forms of separationism. (Incidentally, there is an awkwardness when speaking about this. Concepts are often held to be rather than have contents. But if one separates the concept and its content one cannot speak that way. This may be another reason to pause on the nature of concepts.)

On some other important views, too, the talk of concepts having parts is not very happy, or at least not very obviously applicable: consider inferentialism or conceptual-role semantics, or the prototype theory of concepts. In a way, these points are of course helpful to nonseparationists like Kirchin, for it is the separationist who is positively committed to concepts being separable into parts. But all this also raises a worry that the debate may be misconceived to begin with. I am not saying that one cannot make good sense of the talk of parts of concepts. But the very idea is so contestable and unclear that it would be useful to pause on the issue.

Second, on many views one will want to distinguish between concepts and conceptions: there is what belongs to the concept proper, and then there is the more general notion of an associated conception. (To illustrate: it may belong to the concept of a bachelor that bachelors are unmarried; but things that merely belong to the stereotype of a bachelor just belong to the conception.) The distinction is relevant in the context, for while the noncognitivist may be in trouble if there are evaluative concepts which belong to fact-stating discourse, she can take it in her stride that there are concepts associated with evaluative conceptions which belong to fact-stating discourse. Kirchin in effect appeals to a concept/conception distinction like this, but without a discussion of what concepts are, any such appeal risks being impressionistic.

In Chapter six Kirchin presents his own main positive argument. He defends what he calls the "liberal" view of what it is for a concept to be evaluative, according to which "a concept can be evaluative overall and in any particular instance of its use even if in some instances there is no positive or negative stance being expressed when it is employed" (5). The opposing view he calls "conservative". The argument for nonseparationism can be represented as follows:

(1) The liberal view is true.

(2) Given (1), there are concepts which are evaluative but which wouldn't have counted as evaluative on the conservative view.

(3) No adequate separationist account can be given of those concepts.

(4) But then, separationism is false.

I won't here attempt any overall assessment of the argument. But I have several doubts regarding Kirchin's overall set-up and about how Kirchin makes his case.

Kirchin's idea is that given the liberal view, concepts like MACABRE (to use one example Kirchin relies on) count as evaluative, in a way they supposedly would not so count on the conservative view. MACABRE cannot, the argument continues, be given a separationist treatment. But then given that MACABRE is an evaluative concept, not all evaluative concepts can be given a separationist treatment.

Kirchin frames the dispute as one about the correct view of what it is for a concept to be evaluative. It is not immediately transparent what the terms of the debate are. "Evaluative concept" is a term of art. One might wish to ask whether one couldn't simply use "evaluative concept" more or less strictly, and whether in the strict sense MACABRE isn't evaluative but in a less strict sense it is? The issue is then merely verbal. (Kirchin calls the liberal view "the liberal view on evaluation", making it sound as if the view is on what evaluation is, rather than about what it is for a concept to be evaluative. "Evaluation" is less clearly a term of art than "evaluative concept" is.)

This is not to say that there are no substantive questions nearby. One can approach matters from a resolutely theoretical angle: are the concepts under dispute (MACABRE and the like) similar to paradigmatic evaluative concepts in such a way that one and the same theory will need to cover them all? But although Kirchin does discuss supposed similarities, he does not clearly approach the issue from that kind of theoretical angle.

In the course of laying out his argument, Kirchin says, e.g.,

When I say of a novel that it was macabre, and do not intend praise or blame or anything else positive or negative, I am still offering evaluation of it . . . because my categorization of it in this instance relies on, or is an expression of, an understanding that encompasses times and instances when there are explicit types of praise and blame or other positive and negative reactions. (134)

Kirchin's reasoning regarding MACABRE may generalize in unwanted ways. Consider concepts that are in some sense functional but intuitively not evaluative, like SIEVE and BUCKET. Understanding these concepts arguably in some sense involves knowledge of possible instances where praise and blame (and positive and negative reactions) are appropriate. If I understand these concepts, then I know that in a situation where a bucket is called for, I will be blameworthy and subject to negative reactions if I instead bring a sieve, and vice versa. By Kirchin's lights, don't I then offer evaluation of something when I call it a sieve? There is some sense in which I do, as I do communicate that it would be good for certain purposes and bad for others. But I assume that Kirchin wouldn't want to count SIEVE as evaluative. (Kirchin (137) mentions other functional concepts, AEROPLANE, PEN and BOOK, as non-evaluative.) But where, by Kirchin's lights, is the relevant supposed difference between SIEVE and MACABRE? There may well be one, but I don't see such a difference helpfully elucidated.

Later (137), Kirchin stresses that evaluative concepts "encompass the ability to praise and blame, and express positive and negative stances" -- and this again suggests overgeneration worries. Again, if you ask me to bring a bucket and I instead bring a sieve, you can say "but that's a sieve!" thereby blaming me and expressing a negative stance. At one point (135; my emphasis), Kirchin speaks of "how important it often is for some concepts . . . to convey pro and con stances", and seems to suggest that if this is sufficiently important "for a concept", then the concept is "evaluative overall". But the notion of importance remains unelaborated.

Kirchin himself occasionally says that he replaces a simple evaluative/non-evaluative distinction by a picture where there is much more of a grey area (e.g. 4, 137). But he is not very careful when discussing this. He says, "there are some concepts that can be seen as evaluative, and by their nature call into question the idea that we have a sharp dividing line between evaluative concepts and others" (137). It seems that the concepts he has in mind are ones like MACABRE, but Kirchin classes them as evaluative. How then do they call into question the idea of a sharp dividing line? They would do so only if they were borderline cases of being evaluative.

Kirchin (136) anticipates that critics may complain that he has not offered an explicit characterization of what he means by "evaluative". In response, he says that positive views can be articulated in other ways. Fair enough, perhaps. But it would have been nice to see careful in-depth discussion of a range of examples, including potential counterexamples; as well as a discussion of questions of taxonomy such as how to distinguish concepts from conceptions, and how to distinguish the properly evaluative from the merely evaluatively relevant.

Especially given Kirchin's methodology, with its focus on examples instead of theories or definitions, one might have wished for more detailed attention to a greater variety of examples. As Brent Kyle (forthcoming) discusses in his review of Kirchin's book, concepts of the form GOOD F and BAD F may present problems for Kirchin. GOOD is positive but for some F, GOOD F can arguably convey something negative. Kyle mentions GOOD LIAR. Other examples might be GOOD BROWNSHIRT or GOOD LACKEY. Kirchin seems to agree, saying (154) "thin terms may be employed in larger expressions, for example, 'good assassin', and those expressions can end up having evaluative points different from those that are usually associated with the terms of their own". Given this general point about GOOD F-concepts, it is further natural to think that some such concepts can be used to convey both positive, negative and neutral evaluations. Still they are arguably evaluative, and given how the concepts are built up, separationism would appear to be true of them, if it is true of any concepts.

As a contribution to the literature on thick concepts this book will be required reading for anyone who wants to do work on the issues involved. It is an intelligent and well-informed discussion. But I suspect that it will be more appealing to, and more useful for, insiders to the debate than for anyone approaching the debate from the outside, because of the lack of connections to literature outside the specific thick concepts debate.

The book is available for open access from the Oxford University Press web site. Kirchin's initiative to make this happen should be applauded.


I am grateful to Simon Kirchin and to Brent Kyle for helpful discussions of this material.


Dreier, Jamie: 2004, "Meta-Ethics and the Problem of Creeping Minimalism", Philosophical Perspectives 18: 23-44.

Field, Hartry: 2009, "Epistemology Without Metaphysics", Philosophical Studies 143: 249-90.

Kyle, Brent: forthcoming. "Review of Simon Kirchin, Thick Evaluation", Mind.

Schroeder, Mark: 2009, "Hybrid Expressivism: Virtues and Vices", Ethics 119: 257-309.

Väyrynen, Pekka: 2009, The Lewd, the Rude and the Nasty, Oxford University Press, Oxford.