Things: In Touch with the Past

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Carolyn Korsmeyer, Things: In Touch with the Past, Oxford University Press, 2019, 218pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190904876.

Reviewed by Filippo Contesi, University of Barcelona


Carolyn Korsmeyer's monograph bolsters her reputation as a leading innovator in analytic aesthetics research. Like so much of her previous work, this book is beautifully written, thoughtful and thought-provoking, carefully referenced and rich in artistic examples and historical anecdotes.

The book is a defence and analysis of the aesthetic value of genuineness in things. In it, Korsmeyer argues that being before the real specimen of something -- often, though not necessarily, a valuable work of art -- is capable of yielding aesthetically valuable experiences. On her account, moreover, aesthetic value in such experiences is often connected to ethical and cognitive value. Finally, these aesthetically valuable experiences are crucially mediated by the operation of the sense of touch.

At least at first, this last claim is likely to appear as her most contentious. Touch is often practically impossible for ordinary viewers of many genuine specimens of very valuable things, such as a Gutenberg Bible or Michelangelo's David. Protected as they often are by glass encasings, barriers and surveillance technology, these objects are for the most part currently only sensorily accessible through vision.

However, Korsmeyer rejoins, the sense of touch is still at work given the viewers' physical closeness to these objects and the subsequent in-principle possibility of touching them. Korsmeyer's connection between touch and genuineness explicitly resonates with recent claims about the role of contagion in experiences of the authentic. Cognitive scientists Paul Bloom and George Newman, among others, have argued that our valuing authenticity in objects is explained by our implicitly accepting a magical law of contagion (see, e.g., Newman and Bloom 2012). According to such a law, desirable or odious qualities can be transmitted by contact. So, for example, the value that we attribute to the original David kept in the Gallery of the Academy of Florence (and that we do not attribute to the 20th century copy currently visible in the Piazza della Signoria) is explained by the possibility of touching an object that Michelangelo himself touched. Korsmeyer refers to this feature of our implicit reasoning patterns as 'the transitivity of touch'.

Korsmeyer's account of the value of genuineness in terms of the transitivity of touch (I will refer to such an account as TOT) has some plausibility, at least in some cases. However, I would have hoped for greater articulation and defence of TOT. For instance, Korsmeyer references, without addressing them, Greg Currie's (2016) critical remarks on TOT. Among other things, Currie provides the following counterexample to the idea that physical contact really is a crucial factor in what goes on in the relevant cases. Imagine, he says,

the following two paintings: one produced by Picasso but barely touched by him directly with virtually all contact mediated by the brush, and one painted by a minor artist, given to Picasso and worn by him as an eccentric form of insulation one Paris winter. (Currie 2016, 242-243)

Even though Picasso had been much less in contact with it, Currie surmises, the former would obviously be considered more valuable than the latter.

Of course, Currie's counterexample is not necessarily irresistible. In fact, the comparison between the overall values of the two paintings is not what matters. The value of the Picasso-authored painting could be higher simply in virtue of, say, its being a formally better painting. What must be lower, to avoid refutation of the TOT theory, is the additional value that Picasso's touch contributes to the Picasso-authored painting. A more appropriate comparison would be between the following two paintings: the aforementioned Picasso-authored painting and a perceptually indistinguishable copy of the same painting that, although not painted by him, was (later) touched by Picasso as much as his own painting. TOT would predict these two paintings to have the same value, but both Currie and Korsmeyer (as well as Bloom and Newman) would -- I predict -- attribute greater value to the first.

Another issue that could use some clarification concerns the audience (as opposed to the author) side of the chain of contact. According to TOT, the value of an object's genuineness depends on its (believed or imagined) potential to transmit via touch desirable or odious qualities conferred on it by the touch of something else that was desirable or odious. Of course, Korsmeyer points out that such potential does not need to be tested for the value to be appreciated. We do not actually need to touch the object in question to appreciate the object's genuineness. However, Korsmeyer adds, it is "common" to have the urge to touch genuine objects (p. 15).

Nonetheless, at least sometimes, it seems to me we do not have such an urge. For instance, as much as I admire Michelangelo's artistry and would dearly want to have the chance to go to the Gallery of the Academy to be in the presence of the real David, I feel quite indifferent at the prospect of touching the statue if such an opportunity ever arose. Admittedly, I might have some interest in touching it insofar as I imagine it being a very rare opportunity to be able to do so. However, it is not clear to me that I would feel any aesthetic frisson from touching the real statue, or that my aesthetic excitement at being before the real statue would diminish because I cannot touch it. (Perhaps this is because I suspect my appreciation would not be enriched with any new information if I did touch it. As far as I can tell, its surface will feel rather like any other marble surface I have touched in the past. On the other hand, I might want to touch some paintings to ascertain their tactile texture.)

Given this, some questions that I believe would be useful to address are the following. Does TOT predict that, absent any counter-factors, an appreciator will always have the urge to touch (or avoid touching) the genuine object if it had been originally touched by something positively (or negatively) valuable? If so, what would be examples of such counter-factors? If not, why not?

I would also have hoped for a little more discussion of the cross-culturality of the value of encounters with the genuine. At pp. 152 ff., Korsmeyer recounts the spellbinding story of the computer- and machine-driven reconstruction of the Monumental Arch of Palmyra, which is said to look exactly as the original Roman artefact did right before being destroyed by a 2015 ISIL attack. This technological marvel brings Korsmeyer to elaborate on the value of perceptually indistinguishable replicas of important artefacts (a point that will come up again later in this review). In line with her endorsing TOT, she suggests that any such replicas would be less valuable insofar as they would not permit transitivity of touch.

In doing so, she objects to claims made by Roger Michel, the director of the key institution involved in the reconstruction of the Palmyra Arch. Korsmeyer reports Michel as claiming that the value that we attribute to touch reflects a Western concern with the original physicality of the past that other cultures do not share. In such cultures, Michel continues, objects such as the Palmyra Arch rather play the role of "visual cues", or reminders, of a mentally stored history. Korsmeyer notes several problems with Michel's claims (pp. 156-158). I regret not being able to do full justice to her articulate criticisms here. Her most effective response, as I see it, is that the characteristic value of genuine objects lies in their embodying the past -- rather than in simply reminding us of it. As she says, "although the event of being reminded may possess its own charm, reminding is not an adequate analysis of the nature of encounters with the past by means of proximity with the genuine" (p. 156).

However, Korsmeyer's responses do not seem to me to address with sufficient clarity the cross-cultural challenge I take Michel to be advancing (or, if I am wrong in interpreting Michel, the cross-cultural challenge that I would like to see addressed). According to this challenge, non-Western cultures have a different understanding of the nature and value of genuineness. Korsmeyer's own remarks, instead, may give the impression of presupposing our own (as Westerners) understanding of the nature and value of genuineness. We may value encounters with genuine objects insofar as these embody the past; other cultures may value encounters with genuine objects insofar as they are most resembling of the past or make it easy to have a continuity of memory with the past.

Lending further force to the cross-cultural challenge, I postulate, is another striking example Korsmeyer discusses (at pp. 89-90). For the last 1,300 years or so, the most sacred parts of Japan's Ise Jingū shrine complex are reconstructed anew about every twenty years. This ancient ritualistic practice, as Korsmeyer acknowledges, does not seem to be best understood as involving the production each time of a replica of the original shrine. Moreover, similar ritualistic rebuildings occur regularly at other Shinto shrines in Japan. The existence of such practices can be construed as a challenge to TOT. Reconstruction of the shrines for the most part does not permit transitivity of touch (though note that, for instance, the main sacred object in Ise Jingū, the Holy Mirror, is said to be preserved and moved from the old shrine to its new reconstruction). If each reconstruction of the shrine is valued as the genuine artefact, then TOT would seem unable to account for that value.

Another claim for which Korsmeyer argues in the book is that genuineness comes in degrees. As she suggests, very few or no objects survive the passing of time completely intact. This of course raises familiar ontological problems (e.g., Ship of Theseus), which the book discusses at length. In this context, I very much value Korsmeyer's choice to talk mostly of 'genuineness', as opposed to the more obvious 'authenticity' or 'originality'. At least to my mind, talk of genuineness makes it clearer that the interesting issue at hand is an issue of degree, and thus bypasses, at least somewhat, possibly unresolvable ontological puzzles.

To characterize the experience of being in the presence of a genuine object that we value, Korsmeyer borrows the term 'aura' from Walter Benjamin's classic discussion in "The Work of Art in the Age of its Technical Reproducibility". She uses it to refer to "the special nature of encounters with the genuine" (p. 61). She argues that the experience of aura is not completely triggered by perceptual cues, as genuineness is not a perceptually discernible property. As a consequence, even if the copy of Michelangelo's David in the Piazza della Signoria were perceptually indistinguishable from Michelangelo's original, only the latter, together with our knowledge that it is the original David, would appropriately give us the experience of aura.

Furthermore, Korsmeyer suggests, "If some valuable properties are hidden from perceptual discernibility, then they are in principle not reproducible". This, she continues, is one of the reasons for which aura "has not been expunged by the ever-increasing possibility of indistinguishable simulacra" (p. 15). Here, however, I worry that something goes wrong in Korsmeyer's argument. For instance, even though humans cannot perceptually discern ultrasounds (and their corresponding audio frequencies), we are capable of producing them (e.g., by manufacturing dog whistles). So it is false that a property is not reproducible if it is perceptually indiscernible.

However, some perceptually indiscernible properties might not be reproducible. For instance, it could be the case that, even with the most advanced of technologies, we will never be able to build an atom-for-atom replica of the David that is numerically identical to the sculpture in the Gallery of the Academy (at least not without using parts of the latter). As Korsmeyer defines it, then, we might always be able to experience aura. This is true at least as long as we uphold the same notion of, and reverence for the genuine as we do now.

Although the critical remarks I have advanced in this review may have been greater in number than the praises, they pale in their importance when compared to the rich philosophical value that Korsmeyer's book offers. While its discussion of certain issues could have benefited from greater critical depth, the book is a testament to the possibility of making first-rate philosophical contributions that are fascinating and enjoyable to read. I encourage everyone interested in its themes to read it in full for themselves.


I am much obliged to Angelo Cei, Raciel Cuevas, Peter Lamarque, Giulio Pietroiusti and Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews for their kind help with this review.


Currie, G. (2016), "Aesthetic Explanation and the Archaeology of Symbols", British Journal of Aesthetics 56, 233-246.

Newman, G.E., and Bloom, P. (2012), "Art and Authenticity: The Importance of Originals in Judgments of Value", Journal of Experimental Psychology: General, 141, 558-69.