things merely are: Philosophy in the Poetry of Wallace Stevens

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Simon Critchley, things merely are: Philosophy in the Poetry of Wallace Stevens, Routledge, 2005, 160pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415356318.

Reviewed by Gerald L. Bruns, University of Notre Dame


Wallace Stevens was, to borrow a phrase from the Irish poet W. B. Yeats, one of "the last romantics" -- a poet who thought poetry is or could be a species of world-making. His poetry can be read as a pursuit of the question, "World-making in what sense?" This is also the question that Simon Critchley pursues in this fine, all-to-brief attempt to read Stevens as a philosophical poet preoccupied with classical philosophical questions like "How is knowledge possible?" and "How do we know we are not deceived in our natural experience of things?" Critchley's thesis is that in his austere late poetry Stevens puts questions of this sort to rest because he realizes that, as a species of world-making, poetry is a noble failure. The paradox is that only poetry can articulate this fact about itself, which also turns out to be a fact about the world itself: namely, as Critchley's title has it, "things merely are." The turn of the screw is that perhaps only poetry can shed interesting light on this fact about things.

The first half of Critchley's book is devoted to an exposition of something like the Standard Received Version of Stevens's poetics as a skeptical version of transcendental idealism, or the idea that the world is constructed in our experience of it. This version is traditionally derived from a certain way of reading poems like "The Idea of Order at Key West," in which the poet and his silent companion, Ramon Fernandez, respond to a woman singing near the sea. The classic lines are:

And when she sang, the sea,

Whatever self it had, became the self

That was her song, for she was the maker. Then we,

As we beheld her striding there alone,

Knew that there never was for her

Except the one she sang and, singing, made.

At first reading this looks like an anti-realist poem -- the idea being that there is no world for human beings except the one fashioned by our own powers of imagination. Critchley acknowledges that Stevens' poetry shows a powerful attraction to this idea, but he wants to argue that at the same time Stevens always voices a critical attitude that contextualizes this idealization of imagination within alternatives that grant things of the world their irreducibility to our conceptual schemes. So the sea in "The Idea of Order at Key West" is not just one thing: the line, "whatever self it had," is something like a dramatic aside that opens the sea to an exteriority or alterity that sets a limit, however indefinite, to the mind's act of world-making. The sea has a thingness that the mind cannot capture.

Of course, without the act of world-making the world would never be a world for us; it would never be the human world that is the fact of our experience of it. Critchley summarizes this neatly when he says, quite rightly, that for Stevens (at least until his later work) "poetry has to do not with a bare, alien reality, but with a reality with which we are already in contact, a solid existing reality, a world shot through with our cognitive, moral, and aesthetic values" (p. 53). This is a world more accessible to contemporary phenomenology than to the tradition of romantic idealism that informs so much of Stevens' early poetry, most famously the poems of Harmonium (1923) that celebrate

The magnificent cause of being,

The imagination, the one reality

In this imagined world. ("Another Weeping Woman")

Critchley's argument is that in Stevens' poetry this romantic idealism is always accompanied by a critical reflection whose theme is the finitude of imagination, its conditioned existence within an extra-human environment that sets limits to our powers of world-making. Stevens figures this finitude in terms of the imagination's subjection to time -- to the temporality of the seasons, and in particular to winter in which the imagination must confront the monochromatic existence of things in all their blank non-identity. This world without imagination is uninhabitable because it is not a world at all but simply a barren exterior that, in other phases of its existence, the imagination is able to transfigure into moments like "An Ordinary Evening in New Haven" in which imagination and reality seem reciprocal, interchangeable, even identical, neither one asserting an ontological superiority:

We seek

The poem of pure reality, untouched

By trope or deviation, straight to the word.

Straight to the transfixing object, to the object

As the exactest point at which it is itself,

Transfixing by being purely what it is,

A view of New Haven, say, through the certain eye,

The eye made clear of uncertainty, with the sight

Of simple seeing, without reflection. We seek

Nothing beyond reality … .

"The poem of pure reality" is, of course, on oxymoron, but on Critchley's reading it comes down to an experience of the everyday, the ordinary -- what Emerson (and, after him, the philosopher Stanley Cavell) called "the low, the near, the common," or what Emmanuel Levinas named poetry, namely "the proximity of things," their touch or caress of our sensibility.

But for Critchley this is not where Stevens' philosophical importance lies. What attracts Critchley to Stevens are those late poems in which the imagination confronts a world inaccessible to its powers of transformation -- not so much the blankness of winter as the in-between worlds of late autumn and early spring in which the imagination is alive to what remains alien to human experience. Critchley identifies this in-between with Stevens' old age -- that period of waiting that the French writer, Maurice Blanchot, figured in terms of the interminability of dying in which human subjectivity has been turned inside-out, exposed to an alterity that is no longer (or never was) human, an alterity that the late Stevens condenses into the figure of the rock. The rock is the absence of Levinasian proximity. It is a condition of being forsaken by the imagination that once had the power to provide human habitation in the alien world conceptualized by the positivist tradition in philosophy -- a tradition with which Stevens, a philosophical autodidact, was very familiar, and whose intellectual force he never underestimated. Like many of his generation -- among them the New Critics like Allan Tate, John Crowe Ransom, and Cleanth Brooks, who embraced Stevens' poetry as if to recuperate a premodern culture -- Stevens constructed his poetry as an alternative to the rationalization of the world. But he understood this alternative as a limit to both his thinking and his writing. Critchley seems to me to get it right when he says that, in this respect, "Stevens' poetry fails. Maybe all modern poetry fails" (p. 87).

Actually I think Critchley almost gets it right. One wonders what he would make of traditions of modernism that are outside the horizon of Stevens' poetry -- the tradition of Gertrude Stein, William Carlos Williams, the Objectivists Louis Zukofsky and Charles Reznikoff, the Black Mountain school of Charles Olson, Robert Duncan, Robert Creeley, and the North American Language Poets, for whom poetry is no longer a form of mediation but an exploration of the materiality of language in all of its graphic, acoustic, linguistic, social, and cultural dimensions. From the perspective of this tradition, what stands out in Critchley's analysis is his inattention to language. There is no doubt that he admires the remarkable acoustics of Stevens' poetry, and at one point he promises to say something about the sound of words in Stevens' work, but on my reading the language of Stevens' work is allowed to pass beneath his notice.

Nevertheless, Critchley's book is a philosophical tour de force that ought to give philosophers everywhere a bad conscience. Roughly a quarter of a century ago a handful of English-speaking philosophers -- Martha Nussbaum, Alasdair MacIntyre, Richard Rorty, D. Z. Phillips, among some others -- began to take what looked like a philosophical interest in literature. But each of these philosophers was a good cloth-coat Aristotelian for whom narrative gave the definition of literature. And in each case narrative was reduced to some form of propositional logic. Perhaps apart from Stanley Cavell, who for a while took an interest in writers like Coleridge and Wordsworth, Critchley is to my knowledge the only philosopher in his tradition to attempt a serious reading of poetry. This is in stark contrast to European philosophy, which has always engaged in dialogues with poets like Hölderlin, Baudelaire, Mallarmé, Francis Ponge, and Paul Celan, and even writers like Gertrude Stein and James Joyce. What is more, Critchley's reading of Stevens lends an importance to the late poetry that Stevens scholars continue to underestimate. And in the bargain this reading takes the form of a philosophical argument about the resistance of mere things to our capacity to grasp them, whether imaginatively or conceptually. So there's a gauntlet here where one has long been missing. Who will pick it up?

I have not addressed the last chapter of Critchley's book, which is a celebration of the films of Terence Malick -- Badlands, Days of Heaven, and especially The Thin Red Line, which Critchley reads as an anti-war poem as if in answer to Heidegger's question, What are Poets For? (in a time of destitution, or -- what amounts to the same thing -- a time of war). Critchley tries to connect his appreciation of Malick's films with his reading of Stevens' poetry, where the connection appears to lie in an attention to the singularity of things, their resistance to the sense we try to make of them. My sense is that a separate and more detailed monograph on Malick's work would be a more just piece of writing. But for all of that things merely are is very much a manifesto that aims to break the frame of philosophical thinking within the English-speaking tradition. And in the bargain Critchley gives us a fresh reading of Wallace Stevens' work that academic literary criticism desperately needs. My hope is that this book is not just a one-trick pony but the opening of a philosophical investigation into literary modernism, which, so far, philosophy has brushed aside with a superior gesture.