Things: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2

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Stephen Yablo, Things: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2, Oxford University Press, 2010, 323pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199266494.

Reviewed by Jason Turner, University of Leeds


Things is the second volume of Stephen Yablo's collected (to date) papers, and includes the majority of his work in metaphysics. Chapters 1-4 are essays in traditional first-order metaphysics, cleaning up certain issues in modality, intrinsicality, and causation. All are first-rate, deserving the attention of anyone working in these areas, but I will pass them by in silence. For chapters 5-12 make up Yablo's development of his (broadly) fictionalist meta-metaphysics. There's no point going on about how important this body of work is; it is already widely known to contain seminal developments in fictionalism, meta-metaphysics, and the philosophy of mathematics. Anyone interested in working in these areas should be familiar with these papers. This book does us the service of bringing them together as a unified whole. As well as increasing access to the harder-to-find entries, a bound canon presents the body of work as a single body, making it easier to connect common themes and identify important developmental moments in Yablo's fictionalist project.

This project involves three main theses. (Although the theses are apparently meant to extend to abstract objects of any stripe -- properties, possible worlds, etc. -- Yablo focuses primarily on mathematical objects. I'll generally follow suit, but will sometimes switch between the two without warning.)

I (Interpretative): Mathematical statements, as used 'in the wild' (that is, by scientists, logicians, economists, and their ilk), don't have the primary communicative function of describing some realm of abstract objects. They function instead as representational aids to make it easier for us to describe the non-mathematical world.

II (Methodological): The broadly Quinean program in ontology -- looking at what scientists and their friends say while theorizing and then identifying our ontology with what they quantified over -- is bankrupt if they're quantifying over mathematica.

III (Meta-ontological): Questions about the existence of mathematica shouldn't be taken seriously, and people spending time on them should "disengage and find something useful to do" (p. 297).

The bulk of the program derives from Thesis I, and it is fascinating to watch, as the chapters go along, Yablo's views develop and mature. Early Yablo (chapters 5-6) thinks mathematical claims work like metaphor or make-believe claims do. He employs, to new effect, Kendall Walton's (1993) idea that metaphors can be understood as kinds of make-believe games where we use the game's props to say informative things about the non-game world. Early Yablo suggests that mathematical talk is (or is very much like) this kind of metaphor, focusing as much on using this idea to argue for Thesis II as on developing it for its own sake. Unfortunately, it often feels that, in his excitement to shoot down the Quinean program, Early Yablo rushes through important details about the interpretative hypothesis that deserve more attention. For example, it is crucial to Early Yablo that the Waltonian metaphor-as-story line extend to Davidsonian 'open-textured' metaphors (pp. 137-138; 167). But it's unclear whether the line stretches this far: when Prufrock asks me how he will spit out the butt-ends of his days and ways, for instance, I have no idea what game he's playing.

Middle Yablo (chapters 7-9) spends more time on these interpretative details, eventually defending figuralism, the view that mathematical talk is a special case of figurative language, similar to "She has butterflies in her stomach" or "His hackles rose at the suggestion". He retains the basic, Walton-inspired idea of using mathematical language to help us talk about the non-mathematical world; but less is made of the analogy with metaphor per se, and more of the analogy with figurative language in general. Officially, figurative language has both a literal contentand a real content. The literal content is what the statement would mean, if taken literally; the real content is what we in fact communicate with the statement. The literal content of "She has butterflies in her stomach" places various insects in her digestive tract; the real content only claims that she is nervous. The literal content of "The number of planets is even" says something about a relation between planets and a certain type of abstract object; the real content says only that the planets are evenly-numbered.

Later Yablo (chapters 11-12) defends presuppositionalism. (Chapter 10 is a great piece on the neoFregean program with relevance to Yablo's fictionalism, but I am unsure where it falls in the taxonomy.) He first argues that an assertion's presuppositions can fail (sometimes) without keeping the assertion from playing its intended communicative role. Intuitively, this can happen because what the sentence is trying to say can be true (or false) for reasons entirely independent of the presupposition's truth. For instance, "The king of France is not in that chair", said of an empty chair, is true -- and for reasons that are entirely unrelated to France's monarchical state. So the assertion functions fine, presupposition failure notwithstanding. Presuppositionalism claims that mathematical statements (applied ones, at any rate) function this way: "The number of planets is eight" presupposes the existence of numbers, but what it communicates -- that there are eight planets -- is true, and for reasons entirely independent of whether there are numbers. Sentences of this kind are fail-safe: whatever truth-value they have, they would have had it, and for the same reason, whether or not their presuppositions had been true.

Here, Middle Yablo's notion of real content is replaced with that of what an assertion communicates, presuppositions aside; but both fill the same theoretical role: that which the utterance is used to convey, which need not involve mathematica despite overtly referring to (or quantifying over) them. In the introduction Yablo calls this concrete content, but for reasons that will become clear, I prefer calling it unadorned content.

Later Yablo uses presuppositionalism to argue directly for Thesis III, which he calls quizzicalism. More precisely, he argues that there is no fact of the matter about whether there are mathematical objects, from which quizzicalism follows. The idea, very roughly, is that there could be a fact of the matter about whether there are mathematica only if there were some claims with truth-values dependent on these mathematica. But, since all mathematical claims are fail-safe, their truth-values don't depend on whether there are mathematica, and so there's no fact of the matter about whether there are.

My main complaint with the book is that Yablo seems to not appreciate factors that motivate many ontologists. It's as though, having disposed of one bad reason to worry about mathematical ontology, he fails to see that there might be any good ones left. He seems most concerned with ontologists who, like the fictional P and N of chapter 12, hitch their ontological questions to a linguistic star. But there are more reasons to worry about ontology than obviously linguistic ones.

Yablo's own position is that involvement in abstract ontology, across the board (with some slight wrinkles for pure mathematics, discussed in chapter 9), is merely involvement with devices of representational aid. But many who worry about platonism worry precisely that abstracta may be more than just representational aids -- that they're needed not just to make certain sentences true, but also to explain non-linguistic phenomenon. The Quine/Putnam indispensability argument, treated the way Yablo often tends to (implicitly) treat it -- "Whatever you (ineliminably) quantify over in theorizing you must believe in" -- is undercut by Yablo's fictionalism. But that argument can be spun in other ways. Hartry Field (1989: 14-20), for instance, treats it as an inference to the best explanation: if our best explanations ineliminably involve abstracta, then we have reason to believe in abstracta.

There are two ways abstracta could be explanatorily ineliminable. They could be representationally ineliminable (r-ineliminable): we have no way of communicating the explanation without conscripting abstracta as representational aids. Or they could be explanatorily ineliminable (e-ineliminable): part of what's doing the explaining is that the abstracta are thus-and-so; the properties of the abstracta are part of why the phenomenon is as it is.

Yablo ought to be able to recognize the distinction. If Nancy is irritated because she has been hoisted on her own petard, then a petard may be representationally ineliminable to the explanation of her irritation, but isn't really part of why she's upset. If Nancy is a seller of antique explosives and irritated because no one bought her petard, the petard is explanatorily ineliminable, and the explanation makes sense only if she really has one. In the first case, to explain Nancy's irritation the content of our communication need not involve any petards; but in the second case, it had better. The first explanation, but not the second, has a petard-free unadorned content.

Yablo's fictionalism answers the explanatory indispensability argument only if the best theory's quantifications over abstracta are at best r-ineliminable -- or, equivalently, only if they all have abstracta-free unadorned content. And he is convincing when he argues that, in the boring cases -- when we're talking about the number of democrats, or the increasing velocity of a particle, or the set of all electrons -- we're saying something with an abstracta-free unadorned content. Even if we can't paraphrase into nominalistic-friendly terms, we can see what's being said about the concrete world. Ontologists motivated by worries about the boring cases are given plenty of reason to relax.

But best science produces talk of abstracta not easily assimilated to these cases. As David Malament (1982) pointed out, theories such as classical quantum mechanics (or quantum field theory) which describe a system's evolution using a Hamiltonian seem to ineliminably involve ascribing properties and relations to possible dynamical states -- presumably abstract objects if ever there were. If we accept these theories as best explanations, we'll want to know whether these possible dynamical states are r- or e-ineliminable. Unfortunately, it's hard to see what it would be for these possible dynamical states to be mere representational aids for describing concrete reality. What kind of thing are we saying about concrete reality when we ascribe properties to these states? This isn't a plea for a paraphrase, analysis, or nominalized science. It's just a plea for some sort of clue to their nominalistic representational function. If no clue can be found, we might fairly suspect these possible dynamical states to be themselves mixed up with the concrete world in an irreducible way, not just as representational aids but as helping the world figure out how to do its thing.

Yablo sheds no light on what the unadorned contents of, say, quantum-mechanical statements might look like. But he also seems to have little patience with the sort of project that would shed such light. For instance, talking of Field's (1980) program of nominalizing science, he writes

Why should we be asked to demathematize science, if ordinary science's mathematical aspects can be understood on some other basis than that they are true? . . . The point of nominalizing a theory is not achieved unless a further condition is met [viz, that we can explain the actual applicability of mathematics in science], given which condition there is no longer any need to mathematize the theory. (226)

But what this seems to miss is that his own explanation of the applicability of mathematical claims in science -- that they are, one and all, mere representational aids -- presupposes that there are enough abstracta-free contents to go around, and hence that no abstracta are e-ineliminably implicated in science. Demathematizing science is one way to ensure that science doesn't involve abstracta e-ineliminably.

There may be other ways of ensuring this as well. But it's hard not to hear Yablo's quizzicalist call for ontologists to "disengage and do something useful" as a call to abandon the sorts of project that would give us this assurance. Which means that my complaint is ultimately about Yablo's quizzicalist attitude. Although the quizzicalist argument doesn't officially come until the last chapter, it's previewed in the introduction and the attitude is on display throughout. It shows up explicitly when the fictionalist project kicks off (chapter 5), and seeps in elsewhere as a felt impatience with ontologists and their pesky, persistent inquiries. But under scrutiny, it appears that this attitude stems from Yablo's own confidence that science will never require e-ineliminable abstracta. Given that Yablo never argues that it won't, ontologists who worry that it will can hardly be criticized simply for being less laid-back.

Nor let it be said that the argument for quizzicalism undercuts these ontologists' worries. As a crucial premise, the argument for quizzicalism tells us that mathematical statements are all fail-safe. And it really does need to be all: if any mathematical claim is otherwise, then mathematica have a wedge into affecting truth-value, and the argument breaks down.

I have independent concerns about the fail-safety premise. (If the mathematical presuppositions encode our conception of the mathematical realm, claims left open by our conception which would be closed off by mathematica themselves -- e.g., the continuum hypothesis -- would seem to not be fail-safe.) But even setting these doubts aside, this premise cannot help someone worried that science gives us e-ineliminable abstracta. If the Hamiltonian's being a certain way doesn't derive its explanatory force by representing concrete reality as a certain way, but derives it instead from its own physics-relevant properties, then had the abstract part of reality gone missing, what we would have communicated with the Hamiltonian wouldn't have been true -- or, at least, not for the same reasons. So the claim isn't fail-safe. The argument for quizzicalism is going to be compelling only for someone already convinced that science brings no explanatory threat to nominalism.

So, even granting Theses I and II, at least one legitimate motivation for ontology remains. I hope others do as well, for as should be clear, I am no fan of quizzicalism.

I am, however, a fan of this book. It bears up well through multiple readings, yielding new insights each time around. It is fun to read, enhanced by Yablo's conversational tone and clear, compelling style. Moreover, the work is creative, engaging, rich, interesting, multi-layered, and above all thought-provoking. Friends of its fictionalist program will find much to glean from the volume. Foes, too, will learn much from it, and will benefit from wrestling with the formidable challenges it raises.[1]


Field, Hartry. 1980. Science Without Numbers. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Field, Hartry. 1989. Realism, Mathematics, and Modality. Oxford: Blackwell.

Malament, David. 1982. Review of Hartry Field, Science Without NumbersThe Journal of Philosophy 79.9: 523-534.

Walton, Kendall. 1993. Metaphor and Prop-Oriented Make-Believe. European Journal of Philosophy 1: 39-57.

[1] Thanks to Ted Sider, Robbie Williams, Rich Woodward, and Steve Yablo for helpful conversation and comments.