Thinking About Knowing

Placeholder book cover

Rosenberg, Jay, Thinking About Knowing, Oxford, 2002, 257pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199251339.

Reviewed by Chad Mohler, Truman State University


Jay Rosenberg’s Thinking About Knowing is a rousing defense of an anti-skeptical, pragmatist, perspectivalist account of our epistemic lives. According to this account, the proper aim of our cognitive endeavors is not true belief, but justified belief, where the justification of a belief arises from the reason- and explanation-giving activities of individuals “situated” in particular epistemic contexts. Those contexts determine both the appropriateness of knowledge attributions and the presuppositions of inquiry— presuppositions that, in Moorean style, make it possible for us to fend off skeptical challenges to our beliefs.

In Chapter One, Rosenberg argues that doomed to failure is the project, inspired by Descartes’ First Meditation, of showing that the mere epistemic possibility of radical deception should give us reason to doubt our beliefs. One of Rosenberg’s primary lines of attack goes like this. Whether it is epistemically possible (i.e., logically consistent with what we know) that we are dreaming or otherwise radically deceived appears to depend on how much else we know. If I know a lot, then the claim that I am dreaming or that I am a brain in a vat will not be consistent with much of what I know; for instance, it will not be consistent with the knowledge that I am actually typing in the study right now. So if I have that sort of knowledge, it will not be epistemically possible that I am dreaming or am a radically deceived brain in a vat. It is only if I know relatively little that what I know will be consistent with the dreaming and brain-in-a-vat hypotheses. So for those hypotheses to be genuine epistemic possibilities for us, we must assume that we know very little. For the Cartesian skeptic of the First Meditation to make such an assumption, however, is for him to beg the question against the anti-skeptic, since such a skeptic’s consideration of dreaming and scenarios of radical deception was supposed to show that very assumption to be true (33).

The skeptic may, of course, insist that regardless of what we know, our sensory experience having the phenomenal character it does is logically consistent with our dreaming that experience or our being otherwise radically deceived. Regardless of what we know, then, there is at least the logical possibility that we are mistaken in our beliefs, and contemplation of that possibility is enough to give us reason to doubt those beliefs.

Here, Rosenberg says that pointing out the mere possibility of radical error does not suffice to give us reason to doubt our beliefs. The skeptic also has to provide an argument indicating why we do not know that we are not being radically deceived (53).

At this point, a skeptic may insist that she can provide such an argument, in terms of a contextualist theory of knowledge. We lack the knowledge that we are not being radically deceived, according to her, because we cannot reliably distinguish between the envisioned scenarios of radical deception and the possibility that the world is largely as we take it to be. Those scenarios, in other words, are alternatives that are relevant in the context of discussing whether or not we know that we are radically deceived; and as such, our phenomenal evidence must allow us to eliminate them if we are to know that we are not being radically deceived. Since we cannot so eliminate them, we also cannot know that we are not being radically deceived. That is true for any context in which we are considering whether we have that knowledge, since any such context is one in which the possibility of radical deception is raised.

It is important to note that the negative answer that the skeptic gives here to the question, “Do we know that we are not being radically deceived?” is not an answer that merely assumes that we know very little. In fact, contextualist theories of knowledge allow that we can know quite a bit. It should be clear, then, that the “contextual skeptic” that I am considering here is not a full-blooded global skeptic who questions whether we know anything at all. But since this moderate skeptic at least provides us with an argument for why we cannot know that we are not being radically deceived, she provides us with a reason to doubt our beliefs, according to Rosenberg’s criterion.

As it turns out, Rosenberg himself goes on to defend something like a contextualist theory of knowledge in the fourth and fifth chapters of his book. I say here “something like” such a theory, because Rosenberg wants to put some distance between his own theory—which he calls “perspectivalist”—and the contextualist’s. While both theories allow that the truth of knowledge claims can vary with the context of utterance, the perspectivalist, unlike the contextualist, judges the truth of knowledge claims made in some context other than his own current context according to the standards of that current context of his. Thus, for instance, consider Fred Dretske’s famous zebra example, according to which in one context someone S claims to know that a particular animal is a zebra, but then the possibility is raised that the animal is perhaps a cleverly painted mule that one cannot distinguish from zebras. The contextualist would say that even in the new context, we should be willing to say that S’s previous knowledge claim was true (since we judge that claim according to the standards of the earlier context), even while at the same time we now say (since our new context has higher standards) that S did not know then that the animal was a zebra. The perspectivalist, by contrast, insists that we have to judge all claims about knowledge from our current context. In the context in which we are contemplating cleverly painted mules, we cannot say that S’s previous knowledge claim is true because we judge that claim—”I know that’s a zebra”—on the basis of our current standards for knowledge, which do not allow that a person can know the animal is a zebra without first eliminating the possibility that the animal is a cleverly painted mule (163-164).

Since Rosenberg’s perspectivalist account of knowledge is still roughly contextualist in nature, should he not admit the contextually minded skeptic’s proposal above? What allows him to reject that skeptic’s claim that we do not know we are not being radically deceived? Rosenberg provides an answer to this question in Chapter Five. The chapter builds on results from Chapter Three, in which, drawing on Wilfrid Sellars’ contributions to epistemology, Rosenberg argues that knowledge is an essentially normative notion—to know that p is an achievement of epistemic excellence for the knower, indicating that the knower is in an optimal epistemic position both objectively and subjectively with respect to p. Being in an optimal subjective epistemic position, in turn, requires that the knower be able to locate p in the “space of reasons”: the knower is doing the best he can to “proportion his subjective convictions to his objective epistemic entitlements” by supporting one’s belief that p with reasons (130-131). This element of justification in knowledge is what Rosenberg calls proceduralist in nature. According to a proceduralist view of justification, what is fundamentally justified or not is the conduct of individuals as they go about validating their beliefs through reason-giving practices (113-114).

The proceduralist notion is important, for it makes possible Rosenberg’s Chapter Five response to the skeptic. If we are to have knowledge or justified belief in any particular area, then according to proceduralism, we have to engage in an inquiry that conforms to certain “epistemics”— “procedures for transforming propositions from open questions into propositions with settled status” (188). In the course of the inquiry, those engaged in it will keep track (implicitly or otherwise) of which propositions remain open questions and which propositions are settled and hence capable of serving as presuppositions of future inquiry. When it comes to inquiries concerning skepticism, Rosenberg argues that any “inquiry” investigating whether or not we know we are being radically deceived is not really a genuine inquiry at all. That is because those engaged in the inquiry will not regard as an open question what the inquiry is trying to open as a question. The inquiry “begins by proposing to open questions, concerning, for example, the very existence of other persons— questions which, in the context of any collaborative enquiry, informed by a shared epistemics and conducted within a shared global context of settled background information, are already necessarily closed” (199). Rosenberg’s answer to the skeptic, then, is that there is no context in which the possibility of radical deception could ever be legitimately entertained— no context in which the possibility that we are being radically deceived is not already eliminated. His answer is very much in the Moorean spirit that he cultivates throughout Chapter Five.

Rosenberg makes much here of the claim that inquiry is governed by “public norms of correctness”—hence, the closure of the question concerning whether other persons exist. Rosenberg does not, however, make it clear why that inquiry must take place only in the context of some community. What Rosenberg does not explicitly rule out is the possibility that those norms could be established within a single individual who, solely for the purposes of inquiry, countenances his fellow inquirers (including even the skeptic herself) as potentially no more than convenient fictions, well-placed in his mind for furthering his internal dialogue about the possibility of radical deception. Perhaps Rosenberg could develop a Wittgensteinian-style private language argument to support the notion that norms and procedures for inquiry could not be established solipsistically. But no such argument is in evidence in what Rosenberg actually says. Without such an argument, Rosenberg’s inroads against global skepticism are not as well-paved as they could be.

One of the more intriguing portions of Rosenberg’s book is his discussion of what the aim of inquiry is and what shape that aim gives to our belief-forming practices. It may be a little disingenuous here to speak of “the” aim of inquiry, since it is reasonable to think that our cognitive endeavors potentially have several aims—to improve our emotional health, to come to a greater understanding of some particular subject, to improve the organizational unity and coherence of our beliefs, and so on. Nevertheless, perhaps we can think of “the” goal of inquiry as a goal of inquiry more fundamental than any of these—more fundamental in the sense that pursuit of it is in some way involved in the pursuit of any one of the just-mentioned particular goals. One such general goal might be the goal of having true belief. Rosenberg’s bold claim in Chapter Six is that the aim of inquiry is not, in fact, true belief; rather, it is justified belief. The reason, he says, is that neither do beliefs have epistemically accessible “truth-determinative” features—they do not “wear on their sleeves,” as it were, their truth or falsity—nor do we have independent means of establishing the beliefs’ reliability or any sure connection between our beliefs’ justification and their truth. Thus, we cannot realistically treat true belief as the end of inquiry, since we can never be sure we ever get there (215-218).

Given Rosenberg’s earlier advocacy of the view that all inquiry is perspectival and “situated” in a community with its particular open questions and its settled ones (187-188), this line of reasoning is an odd one for him to be making. If, in fact, any inquiry accepts certain claims as established and given, then Rosenberg has a natural way for us to establish the truth-justification link or the reliability of our beliefs: our beliefs can be assessed as reliable (or not) relative to those propositions which we take for granted and accept as given. To worry about the reliability of our belief in those “closed question” propositions in addition to the reliability of our belief in those propositions which still pose open questions for us—and hence to worry about the reliability of our beliefs as a whole—requires us to admit as a real possibility that possibility which Rosenberg says we cannot admit in any legitimate inquiry—the possibility that our beliefs taken as a whole are mostly false.

Having rejected true belief as the end of our cognitive activity, Rosenberg puts in its place justified belief. Rosenberg is influenced here by Pierce’s contention that the end of inquiry is settled opinion or fixed belief, opinion from which the “irritant” of doubt has been removed. Stability in opinion is not sufficient to serve as the end of inquiry, though, since our opinion’s being settled now does not preclude fanatical dogmatism (232-233), nor does it guarantee the capacity for our beliefs to remain relatively stable in the light of future inquiry (235). What Rosenberg says we need for our beliefs is a “fixative.” That fixative, he suggests, is provided by the beliefs’ being justified. To understand why justification fixes belief, Rosenberg has us consider the way Pierce says science allows us to reach some stability in our “matter-of-factual” (empirical) beliefs. In broad terms, Pierce’s account goes like this. Our perceptual experience occasionally leads us to form judgments that are “dissonant” with our previous expectations for that experience. That dissonance leads to the creation in us of doubt about those expectations, and that doubt is eliminated when we can accommodate those judgments in an explanatory account that explains not only our current experience but also future experiences that we may come to have. The beliefs that come about as the result of this abductive reasoning are justified by that reasoning. Doubt is eliminated, and the so-justified beliefs thereby enjoy relative stability (244).

Rosenberg’s account here is quite suggestive and promising; I hope his future work addresses questions that this last chapter leaves hanging. For instance, as noted above, Rosenberg admits that stability and the elimination of doubt, on their own, are not sufficient to serve as the ends of inquiry. What else, though, does being abductively justified in our beliefs give us, if, in fact, we are no longer thinking of justification’s link to truth as the point of having justified beliefs? Is it appropriate to think of explanation itself as the end of inquiry which abductive justification constitutes? Also, are there any constraints we may face in extending Rosenberg’s conclusions about abductive justification beyond the realm of science to other areas of inquiry: ethics, religion, and aesthetics, for instance?

Those readers who have the motivation to work through all the exegetical detail Rosenberg gives us will be duly rewarded by a compelling journey that makes us further appreciate the contributions Descartes, Kant, Sellars, Moore, Pierce, and others have made to the investigation of important issues in epistemology. Rosenberg, drawing in insightful, original, and provocative ways on these philosophers, gets us to think anew about the problems of skepticism, knowledge, and the aim of inquiry. Thinking About Knowing will lead its readers to some fruitful “thinking about knowing” of their own.