Thinking about Love: Essays in Contemporary Continental Philosophy

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Diane Enns and Antonio Calcagno (eds.), Thinking about Love: Essays in Contemporary Continental Philosophy, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2015, 262pp., $84.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780271070964.

Reviewed by Helen A. Fielding, The University of Western Ontario


This collection addresses a lacuna in contemporary continental philosophy: thinking about love. As the editors explain, Western philosophers tend to avoid addressing love since it is associated more closely with the body and emotion, instead attending to what is deemed to be the business of philosophy, delimiting reason. The matter of love has been left to poets and musicians. But as they further point out, "love is not beyond thinking." Love both motivates and transforms us, and is thus part of the human condition (1). While a few philosophers in the Anglo-American philosophical tradition have explicitly addressed love, within the continental tradition, philosophical meditation on love has generally been linked to theology. This means there is a need for attention from continental philosophers on this theme since they raise different kinds of questions concerning love, questions about subjectivity, identity and the ways we relate to one another. As such, this collection provides a much-needed intervention on the intertwinings of thinking and love. To this end, the book is thematically organized: divided into five parts it addresses the limits of love, love's intersection with the divine, with politics and with phenomenological experience as well as the stories love allows us to tell.

In the first section, "Human Vulnerability and the Limits of Love," three philosophers explore what defines love as love, and their conclusions vary widely, provoking the question of whether it's even possible to find agreement about what constitutes love. Perhaps it is precisely the varied possibilities for defining love's limits -- possibilities that cannot be discovered through reason -- that make it so difficult to thematize and yet provide the other side to reason that makes it human. For Todd May, the limit of love is our mortality. That we will die is what guarantees its intensity. Exploring the ways in which love has been taken up in the analytic tradition, he concludes that the one common element is that romantic love entails an intensity of engagement (23). Because romantic love between two people "occurs not only for but also with the other," it requires that the relationship be between equals who also "consider each other to be equals" (24). In his reading of the film Ground Hog Day (1993), where one day is repeated over and over again, he further concludes that a relationship between equals not governed by the limit of death would lose its intensity, and similarly, watching our lover age reminds us of the limit of the time we will be together, of its ephemerality.

Diane Enns' lyrical essay, "Love's Limit", takes a completely different turn. Countering the liberal perspective that champions love between equal and sovereign selves who enjoy a love that endures and "is not supposed to fail" (33), she defends love between imperfect individuals, where there is jealously, obsessiveness, and abandonment of the self. It is love that is more often referred to as "masochism, repetition compulsion, fantasy, an unhealthy attachment" (34). In dialogue with Beauvoir she suggests we consider the limit of love from the "perspective of the loving self". This shift in focus from autonomy to vulnerability entails openness and risk: "For there is no love without abandoning one's position and 'crossing' over an abyss like an acrobat" (36-37). To love imperfectly is human, and "failed relationships do not necessitate failed love" (41). Thus to love is to open ourselves to the other's vulnerabilities and weaknesses, to open our selves to being transformed by love. Accordingly, the limit of love for Enns is when the lover's "capacity for love is harmed." For "lovers cannot endure all things." What must be preserved are the conditions of love that allow for a spacing and "movement of love between two" (43). It is the question of whether it's even possible to love in our contemporary world that John Caruana explores. Drawing on the work of Julia Kristeva, he explores the symbolic and semiotic aspects of love, arguing that contemporary phenomena of self-harm ranging from cutting to the ISIS terrorist "prepared to maim and kill innocents" point towards "an unparalleled crisis in subjectivity, an inability to love" (47). What are required are narratives and images to support psychic renewal, and the ability to believe again in the world, "a secular symbolic discourse that would promote flourishing subjects" (59).

The four essays in part two, "Love, Desire, and the Divine," focus on love as transcendence. In this section, we see consistency amongst the authors who all seem to conclude in some way that transcendence can be found in the particularity of love, in its erotic articulations rather than the universality of love as general and passionless. Christina M. Gschwandtner turns critically to the work of contemporary continental philosophers of religion who are inspired by theological affirmations of Christ's "kenotic" love, which she describes as one of devotion and self-sacrifice. It is the exclusivity of kenotic love that is problematic for Gschwandtner, in that applied to our everyday lives it can provide justification for the kind of self-sacrificing love often demanded of women, or that provides justifications for all kinds of abuse (75). Kenotic love does have place in philosophy, but only as a religious phenomenon rather than a "general phenomenological account of all loving relations". Mélanie Walton, drawing on Lyotard, privileges eros over caritas or charity. The problem with caritas, the Christian narrative of love, is that it ultimately produces a closed system, "a universal, circular, and conditional logic" with a "meaning that has been given in advance," and that "necessitates one's free commitment". As a universal love it does not recognize the particularities of love: "the subject marching under this banner does not actually have the freedom to choose and enact love toward another subject." (103) Erotic desire on the other hand, because it is unpredictable, provides for an open system from which change, and justice can be effected.

Felix Ó Murchadha also comes out on the side of erotic love, arguing against the duality of self that separates the responsible self from passion in the philosophical tradition. Ó Murchadha observes that though there is always the danger of losing oneself in love, ultimately we become fully ourselves only through being in love; thus privileging the autonomous thinking subject is to forget that the self emerges from "the between space of being in love" (96). While Ó Murchadha, focusing on the emergence of the self, concludes that "to be a person is to be in love," Antonio Calcagno turns his attention to the way that desire motivates the mind in its engagement with the world (90). Focusing critically on the work of Hannah Arendt, Calcagno argues her account of the life of the mind requires a "more robust understanding of desire." As he points out, the object of desire, which lies outside the self, is precisely that which moves us to "to desire to think, judge, and will" (114). Indeed, thinking, judging and willing as described by Arendt entail a "kind of passivity or receptivity," which opens the mind to that which is other than the self. The mind's activity is accordingly "solicited by desire" for that which lies beyond the self, and this desire needs to be taken into account in our theorizing about the life of the mind.

While the thematic arrangement of the essays does work, any such arrangement sets up particular conversations. The two essays on love and politics, for example, consider how change can emerge when love is considered as a social phenomenon. Sophie Bourgault considers the role of love in politics by turning to the seemingly disparate perspectives of Arendt and Simone Weil. There is no place for love and compassion in politics according to Arendt, while for Weil, compassion is precisely what is called for. For Arendt, politics is characterized by speech and action, but Weil's concern is that those who are most disadvantaged have no voice. But as Bourgault points out, the two thinkers do come together in their agreement that what is needed in our modern world is "more thoughtfulness and (empathetic) attention" (165). Rethought as attention, love has a place in the social and political world. This is not insignificant, as Christian Lotz reminds us. For, within the context of recent left political philosophy developed by thinkers such as Hardt, Negri, and Badiou, love seems to be granted a metaphysical status. Lotz reminds us, however, of the Marxist critique of essentialist conceptions of love which "tend to overlook the material, historical, and social form that love takes on in real individuals" shaped by class (131). Also connecting the particular to the general, Lotz points out that "What we can see, feel hear is not sensual in an abstract sense; rather, it is the result of concrete historical forms of how we are related to one another, and of how the sensual world is itself reproduced through labor" (133). In other words, love allows us to engage in particular and concrete relations in a world that is shaped through material relations. Lotz concludes that rather than thinking about love "in terms of a truth procedure (Badiou) or an ontological event (Negri)," it is the social aspect of love, and the ways in which it is produced to which we should turn our attention (147).

Dorothea Olkowski, whose essay completes the fourth part on the phenomenological experience of love, is also concerned with forms of love, in particular in light of recent neurophysiological explanations of love that cannot account for intentionality. In working through her ontology of love, she draws on Merleau-Ponty, in particular his early work "on the interplay of the organism and the phenomenal field" (202). Like Lotz, Olkowski thinks through sensory perception drawing on form. In this case the "sensory value of each element is determined by its function in the whole and varies with it. Every action undertaken modifies the field where it occurs and establishes lines of force within which action unfolds and alters the phenomenal field" (207). This means that sensory input alone is not sufficient for explaining why we respond in certain ways. Instead, what is needed is an account of intentionality, of consciousness of certain objects and the ways we take them up, consciousness of the actions we take, of the words we speak, and the ways in which these "consciously constitute the intention(s) in which they are involved" (207). Consciousness and the world are intertwined. Relations are motivated and not causal in one direction, and "there is a 'network of significative intentions,' more or less clear, lived rather than known" (208). So desire cannot be mere instinct or drive. Instincts are part of an entire organism or structure, which means that they cannot be separated out from perception, intelligence and emotions. Physical events do not equate with situations, which are the lived interpretation of what takes place.

Also drawing on Merleau-Ponty and our intertwinement with the world, Fiona Utley explores the ways in which the loving bonds we create in the world not only anchor us there but also provide us with "another self who shares and knows the intimate structures of our world" (169). This means for Utley that to love we must trust. Thus, the trust that sustains this love must be central to human existence. Utley picks up here on a theme others in this volume have explored, namely that loving makes us vulnerable. It opens us to the risk of heartbreak, of "violence, cruelty and death" (175). Marguerite La Caze explores this close relation between love and hate through the work of Beauvoir. Supporting Utley's findings, she concludes that love allows for both reciprocal and ambiguous relations that belong to being human. Hate, however, is not relational as such. It stresses the "material, object status of the hated offender."

The final two essays are thematized as love stories. Dawne McCance writes eloquently about Derrida as a philosopher who did not practice "philosophical detachment" when he wrote about love. Coming back to the opening theme that any binary of reason and emotion is doomed from the start, she explains how Derrida's "deconstruction is not only about acknowledging difference", but "is also about being open to being altered in one's encounter" with it (222). It is about changing how we think as well as what we think about. Alphonso Lingis puts this into practice, dwelling on practices of loving and living that shape the ways we think about ourselves and our relations to nature.

This collection opens up an overdue discussion of the intersections of love and thinking within the continental tradition. Some of the observations were ones I anticipated; others were surprising. My only real criticism is that there is no mention of the work of Luce Irigaray, a contemporary continental philosopher for whom love is at the center of her work. Nonetheless, it is easy to fault a work for what it has not done. In the end it must be judged by what it has accomplished, and that by all measures is much.