Thinking about Oneself: From Nonconceptual Content to the Concept of a Self

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Kristina Musholt, Thinking about Oneself: From Nonconceptual Content to the Concept of a Self, MIT Press, 2015, 210pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262029209.

Reviewed by Dan Zahavi, University of Copenhagen


What is self-consciousness? What is the relation between self-consciousness and object-consciousness and between self-consciousness and other-consciousness? Is self-consciousness a question of recognizing one’s own specular image? Does it presuppose mastery of the first-person pronoun or the ability to apply a theory of mind? Is it innate or does it emerge during development and social interaction? The philosophical, psychological, psychiatric and neuroscientific literature is filled with competing, conflicting and complementary proposals. In her book, Kristina Musholt sets out to answer these questions and to offer an account of self-consciousness that is neither circular nor dependent upon irreducible unanalyzable elements.

Although Musholt is committed to the kind of naturalism that encourages the exchange between philosophy and empirical science, and although her main interlocutors are figures in analytic philosophy of mind and language such as Wittgenstein, Shoemaker, Castañeda, Anscombe, Perry, Evans etc., she is also drawing on another source of inspiration, namely German Idealism. . As Dieter Henrich points out in his 1967 essay "Fichte's ursprüngliche Einsicht", one of Fichte's enduring insights is that any attempt to conceive of self-consciousness as a form of object cognition, i.e., as a subject-object relation, is bound to fail since it will either lead to a regress or presuppose what it is supposed to explain. To know oneself as an object presupposes a prior form of self-familiarity, for otherwise the knowledge of oneself as an object will not be of oneself, but of an object like any other. In short, the reflecting subject can only recognize itself in the reflected object, can only self-identify, if it is already in possession of self-consciousness. The solution offered by Henrich, Manfred Frank and other members of the so-called Heidelberg School was to posit the existence of a more primitive form of non-objectifying pre-reflective self-consciousness. But as Musholt argues, one problem with this alternative is that pre-reflective self-consciousness was considered unanalyzable and only characterized negatively. It consequently remained somewhat mysterious.

Musholt's book can be seen as an attempt to address this flaw. In a first step, she engages with the kind of approach found in, for instance, José Luis Bermúdez, according to which we need to appeal to simpler, more primitive, nonlinguistic and nonconceptual forms of self-representation if we are to understand and explain the possibility of full-blown self-consciousness. As Musholt points out, however, this kind of self-representationalism, which argues that the self is part of the non-conceptual content of perceptual and bodily experience, continues to adopt a subject-object model of self-consciousness and consequently remains vulnerable to the difficulty identified by Fichte and Henrich (55). Musholt's alternative proposal, echoing ideas found in phenomenology, is that the self rather than figuring primarily in the representational content of the experience should be located in the mode: "Experience is necessarily subjective in the sense of being for a subject, because it is given in a mode that is specific to the experiencing subject" (85), that is, "conscious experience is always experience for a subject and is experienced from the perspective of the experiencing subject" (63). Her claim is then that self-consciousness proper, e.g., "a first-person judgment that is based on perceptual or bodily experience exploits the fact that the relevant mode of experience is self-specific by making this fact -- which is implicit in the experience -- explicit" (81).

Both perception and bodily experience contain self-specifying information, and they can guide intentional behavior in virtue of their agent-relative information, but they do not explicitly represent the self. They are necessary precursors to genuine self-conscious thought, they can be said to provide the basis for paradigmatic forms of self-consciousness, but according to Musholt, we do need to keep onto the difference between implicitly self-related information and explicit self-representation (26). Only the latter amount to self-consciousness (51), which Musholt repeatedly defines as the ability to think "I"-thoughts, i.e., it concerns the ability to self-ascribe using the first-person pronoun (2).

The important question that now has to be asked is how we get from implicitly self-related information to explicit self-representation. Partially drawing on the work of Annette Karmiloff-Smith, Musholt acknowledges that we have to move beyond the simple dichotomy of non-conceptual and conceptual forms of representation towards a more fine-grained level-based approach. Her central idea, articulated in the longest chapter of the book entitled "Self and Others, or The Emergence of Self-Consciousness", is that the move from consciousness to self-consciousness happens within intersubjectivity (115). Intersubjectivity is required for the acquisition of the ability to think of oneself since self-consciousness is essentially a contrastive notion. One learns to represent oneself explicitly by learning to distinguish one's own mental and bodily states from those of others (162). Indeed, any explicit reference to self only makes sense for someone who is being aware of the existence of other subjects, to whom it intends to draw a contrast (120). Referencing work in developmental psychology, and engaging with the theory of mind debate and the literature on mirror self-recognition, Musholt suggests that self-consciousness and other-consciousness develop in tandem in four steps. At birth, there is not yet any self-other differentiation. From nine-twelve months onwards there is implicit representation of self-other. From fourteen-eighteen months onwards, there is explicit self-other differentiation and representation of intentional relations, and from four years onwards, there is explicit and conceptual self- and other-representation (147).

Thinking about Oneself is well written, informative and, given its premises, to a large extent convincing. However, let me point to a few contestable issues.

At one point in her discussion, Musholt writes that one could also have decided "to call experiences that contain implicitly self-related information forms of primitive self-consciousness" (67). That is, of course, quite right. This is not Musholt's own preference, but had one opted for this choice, the conclusion of the book would have had to be rewritten. What is constitutively dependent upon intersubjectivity is not self-consciousness per se, but an especially sophisticated form of self-consciousness. That this modified conclusion might actually be the correct conclusion is even admitted by Musholt herself. In a footnote, she acknowledges that Philippe Rochat and Susan Hespos have presented evidence indicating that newborn infants are in possession of a bodily-based innate capacity to differentiate self from other, and that this might suggest that bodily self-awareness emerges before psychological self-awareness (179). One can then only wonder why Musholt simultaneously defends the view that implicit self-other representation only emerges around 9 months of age and that there at birth is not yet any self-other differentiation.

Musholt often distinguishes self-representationalism from what she calls non-self-representationalism or the "no-self" approach (xii, 45). This choice of terms is, however, also somewhat puzzling and might ultimately suggest that there is more at stake here than merely terminological quibbles. First, to speak of a "no-self" approach in this context is somewhat unfortunate since that locution is primarily used by people who favor some form of anti-realism about the self, i.e., by people who are out to deny the existence and reality of the self. There is nothing in Musholt's book to suggest that she shares that view. Would it consequently not have been better to speak of a non-representationalist-self approach than of non-self-representationalism? Furthermore, in the literature on self-consciousness one finds a distinction between egological and non-egological accounts of self-consciousness. The distinction concerns the question of whether (basic) self-consciousness is best understood as consciousness of self or whether it should rather be understood as merely involving a form of self-reflexivity, i.e., as a question of the special access or acquaintance that each consciousness has to itself. Henrich, for example, favors the latter option and has argued that self-aware consciousness is an egoless dimension. Finally, in the contemporary philosophy of mind debate, "self-representionalism" is normally used as the label for a distinct alternative to higher-order representationalism; one that argues that we need to appeal to self-consciousness if we wish to understand the difference between conscious and non-conscious mental states.

Why is all of this important? Because it shows that there is an influential and traditional way of discussing self-consciousness with which Musholt doesn't engage sufficiently. One that does not narrowly identify self-consciousness with the ability to think "I"-thoughts, but which rather sees it as an integral and constitutive feature of consciousness. Aristotle, Arnauld, Brentano, Sartre and Henrich, to mention just a few, have held versions of such a view. In the very beginning of her book, Musholt makes it clear that her focus is on self-consciousness rather than on consciousness, and that she is not concerned with the question of how a state becomes conscious in the first place. This decision might seem quite innocuous, but it sets the stage and very much prepares the way for Musholt's conclusion concerning the extent to which self-consciousness depends on intersubjectivity. Had she instead opted for the more deflationary notion of self-consciousness -- which somewhat paradoxically is one that can be found in the Heidelberg School and in phenomenology -- her conclusion would have been far more controversial (which is not to say that one cannot also find contemporary defenders of the view that phenomenal consciousness depends on intersubjectivity).

One might disagree with some of Musholt's moves, but her book contains interesting and stimulating ideas concerning the transition from implicit to explicit self-consciousness.